Personal Identity: Complex or Simple?

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Georg Gasser and Matthias Stefan (eds.), Personal Identity: Complex or Simple?, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 268pp., $95.00 (hnk), ISBN 9781107014442.

Reviewed by Annalisa Coliva, Università di Modena e Reggio Emilia/COGITO


This valuable collection brings together twelve original contributions and one reply by some of the most prominent theorists working on the issue of personal identity. The question at the heart of the book is whether personal identity is simple or complex.

Part of the problem consists in framing the very question on which it focuses. The four essays making up Part I endeavor to clarify the question's meaning, or at least its multiple facets. In his dialogue "Chitchat on personal identity", David Barnett highlights the many ways in which we can think of the simple/complex divide. But the most interesting yet disparaging voice is Eric Olson who ("In search of the simple view") claims that traditional ways of framing that opposition don't work and that alternative ones don't match the results of the usual ways of drawing it. Hence, the divide between simple and complex views remains quite elusive.

Be that as it may, it is worth summarizing the way in which the divide is usually characterized. Advocates of the complex view will presumably uphold a specific completion of the following formula:

Necessarily, if x is a human person at t and y exists at t*x = y iff and because . . .

For instance, ". . . iff and because x's and y's mental states are in a specific relation to one another, or there is some definite relation among x's and y's physical states." It is important for these reductionist views -- insofar as they take persons to consist ultimately in something else, such as relations among psychological or physical states -- that the right hand-side of the biconditional be informative and non-circular. Supporters of the simple view, in contrast, deny that our persistence or identity over time consists in anything and therefore deny that the preceding formula can be completed in an informative, non-circular way.

Ryan Wasserman ("Personal identity, indeterminacy and obligation") claims that our instinctive reluctance to endorse complex views of personal identity, such as Derek Parfit's (1984), is that it gives rise to the indeterminacy of personal identity and, consequently of obligation. According to Wasserman since the latter view is untenable, so is the former.

Of course the claim is interesting, but two things are worth pointing out. First, that other theorists (e.g., Carol Rovane (1998)) have endorsed a neo-Lockean account of persons. They do so precisely because on their view it makes better sense than alternative explanations of our practice of finding group persons (e.g., firms, Departments and football teams) accountable for their actions, insofar as they can be seen as carrying them out as part of one specific, rational deliberation, i.e. as part of one single rational point of view. Second, it isn't clear why an essay that clearly privileges the simple account of personal identity should figure in the volume's section dedicated to framing the question. True, it attempts to provide a diagnosis of our (supposed) reluctance to endorse the complex view (or at any rate one possible specimen of it), but this seems to depend on taking for granted that there is such a divide and that we know where it lies, or at least on which side of it different accounts of personal identity fall.

Similar worries can be raised with respect to placing Harold Noonan's "Personal identity and its perplexities" in Part I.  Noonan develops an intricate defense of the complex view of personal identity. He takes time to explain what he means by "a complex view of personal identity", namely "the view that there are non-trivial, non-redundant, non-identity-involving diachronic constraints on personhood" (p. 87). But he devotes the bulk of his essay to showing that a neo-Lockean account of diachronic personal identity can respond to several objections, for instance: that such an account is committed to the existence of too many thinkers and that it gives rise to the problem of knowing that one is a given person (as specified by the requirements of a neo-Lockean account) and not the human animal, coincident with it, who is thinking falsely that he is a person (pp. 89-90). Furthermore, Noonan defends the account against the objection that since human animals are thinkers and thinkers count as persons for the neo-Lockean view, the latter is incoherent for it "must acknowledge different kinds of person with different persistence conditions" (p. 90). The key idea, according to Noonan, is distinguishing between thinkers of thoughts and objects of first-person reference. Finally, he defends neo-Lockean accounts from the indeterminacy objection, which we have already seen at work in Wasserman's contribution.

Part II, "Arguments For and Against Simplicity", contains four essays and one reply. In the first of these, Richard Swinburne predictably (see Swinburne and Shoemaker 1984), defends a simple view of personal identity in the strong form of mind-body dualism, by means of a battery of arguments concerning logical and a posteriori metaphysical possibilities, and by taking conceivability as a guide to determining what is metaphysically possible.[1] As far as I can see, all these arguments hinge on the idea that we have direct awareness of ourselves as continuing subjects of experience that can conceivably survive any number of bodily changes and even the disappearance of their bodies.

Equally predictable is Sydney Shoemaker's attack against simplicity (see Swinburne and Shoemaker 1984), which in fact consists in a defense of his favored version of a neo-Lockean theory of personal identity from various adaptations of the circularity objection, according to which, to put it in E. J. Lowe's terms "conscious states . . . cannot themselves be individuated or identified save in terms which presuppose the identity of persons (or conscious subjects) whose states they are" (Lowe 2009, p. 134; cited p. 132). Shoemaker's key move is to claim that while it is true that a conscious state of a person is necessarily a state of that person (ibid.), this is compatible with the fact that it is a relation between these states "that make(s) it the case that they belong to one and the same person" (p. 133).

In "The probable simplicity of personal identity", Lowe indirectly defends one version of the simplicity view, according to which persons are individual substances as opposed to functional entities. He argues that there is no informative and non-circular criterion of personal identity; i.e. the kind of criterion that advocates of the complex view, including Shoemaker, ought to provide. In so doing, he also gives an interesting reply to Shoemaker's previous defense of neo-Lockeanism. Shoemaker, in turn, offers a brief reply to Lowe.

Martine Nida-Rümelin defends her version of the simple view in "The non-descriptive individual nature of conscious beings". Like Swinburne, by going through a number of quite different and complex thought experiments, she aims to show that we have direct awareness of ourselves as subjects of conscious experience precisely because we undergo such conscious experience. This is supposed to vindicate a form of conceptual mind-body dualism, whereby selves are to be individuated on the basis of such a direct and non-conceptual awareness of themselves as experiencing subjects, while enjoying conscious experiences.

Part III "Reconsidering Simplicity" -- contains four essays. Lynne Rudder Baker ("Personal identity: a not so-simple simple view") defends a particular version of the simple view that I personally find extremely convincing. According to her, there is no place for substance dualism and, as is familiar since Baker (2000), "we are fundamentally persons, who are necessarily embodied", even though "we do not necessarily have the bodies that we in fact have" (pp. 180-1). What makes us persons, according to Baker, is the ability to think first-person thoughts, or to think of ourselves as such, or even to have a first-person perspective essentially. In her view, we are constituted by, even if not identical to, the physical entity that allows us to do that. Persons are therefore emergent, potentially temporally gappy entities, who have ordinary parts (even if they aren't the mereological sum of their parts). They possibly are such that the answer to the question whether they exist at time t is indeterminate.

The last three chapters, by Christian Kanzian, Dean Zimmerman and Hud Hudson, respectively concern whether "person" is a sortal term, whether dualism is to be preferred to materialism and, whether the simple view is compatible with a multiplicity of accounts of time, while complex views aren't, so that we should therefore discount the complex views. Here again I couldn't quite see why these accounts would offer a different, somewhat non-standard account of the simple view and should thus be grouped together in this section. Surely an explanation of the contribution of each chapter to each of these sections would have been helpful, but there is no trace of it in the editors' "Introduction", its other merits notwithstanding.

Finally, let me raise one methodological issue. Personally I have strong sympathy for a non-reductionist account of persons and, in particular, for one possible version of the simple view. Indeed Baker, who avoids substance dualism and whose account seems to fit in with a sensible and scientifically informed account of our place in nature, is my favorite. Yet, the three main versions of the simple view positively presented in the volume -- Swinburne's, Nida-Rümelin's and Baker's -- revolve around the idea of having a first-person perspective. For the first two, this seems to involve a special kind of (perhaps non-conceptual) awareness of oneself as a subject of experience (possibly continuous in time). But for Baker it amounts to the ability of enjoying first-person thoughts -- an ability that clearly depends on the exercise of the first-person concept but that may actually be grounded in further non-conceptual states of an individual.

Whichever view one might favor, it is clear that the nature of a first-person perspective is a topic in the philosophy of mind and of mental content. I think that much would be gained in the metaphysical discussion of personal identity if more attention were paid to the question of what exactly a first-person perspective is and whether it dictates a specific metaphysics, or whether, ultimately, it is compatible with various ones. This would also have the advantage of bringing together these two areas of philosophy and possibly of giving rise to fruitful cross-fertilizations. Yet, for all we have seen so far, it might turn out that possessing a first-person perspective could be compatible, depending on what it means, with mind-body dualism, mind-body monism, or even with the idea that persons are living human animals with both physical and psychological properties, or even relations among psychological states, so long as they are capable of enjoying a first-person perspective. As we saw in passing, a notion of first-person perspective such as Rovane's, according to which it amounts to the ability of making rational deliberations, would actually be compatible with some kind of neo-Lockean account.

So, it seems to me that unless we have a firm grip on what it means to enjoy a first-person perspective, it is difficult to reach ultimate decisions about the metaphysical nature of persons, if it is admitted -- as simple theorists seem to be doing -- that persons are entities essentially capable of enjoying such a first-person perspective. Moreover, it might turn out that even once we have settled for one particular notion of first-person perspective, such as having an awareness of oneself as a subject of experience, a specific metaphysics isn't mandatory. Swinburne's and Nida-Rümelin's respective mind-body dualism and only conceptual mind-body dualism are cases in point.[2] This leaves us with what I think is the big methodological question concerning the debate about personal identity, i.e. on what grounds exactly is it to be adjudicated, if it can be adjudicated at all? This, I hope, will be grist to another volume's mill.[3] While this volume doesn't explicitly tackle that issue, it does enough to show the richness and complexity of present-day metaphysical debates about personal identity.


Baker, L. R.  2000 Persons and Bodies: A Constitution View, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.

Coliva, A. 2006 "Error through misidentification: some varieties", The Journal of Philosophy 103, pp. 402-425.

Coliva, A. 2012a "Which key to all mythologies about the self?", in S. Prosser and F. Recanati (eds.) Immunity to Error through Misidentification. New Essays, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, pp. 22-45.

Coliva, A. 2012b (ed.) The Self and Self-Knowledge, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Gendler, T. Szabò and Hawthorne, J. (eds.) 2002 Conceivability and Possibility, Oxford, Clarendon Press.

Lowe, E. J. 2009 More Kinds of Being: A Further Study of Individuation, Identity and the Logic of Sortal Terms, Malden (MA), Blackwell.

Parfit, D. 1984 Reasons and Persons, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Rovane, C. 1998 The Bounds of Agency: An Essay in Revisionary Metaphysics, Princeton, Princeton University Press.

Rovane, C. 2012 "Does rationality enforce identity?", in A. Coliva (ed.) The Self and Self-Knowledge, Oxford, Oxford University Press, pp. 17-38.

Shoemaker, S. 1970 "Persons and their pasts", American Philosophical Quarterly 7, pp. 269-285.

Swinburne, R. and Shoemaker, S. 1984 Personal Identity, Oxford, Blackwell.

[1] On the complex issue of the relationship between conceivability and possibility, see Gendler and Hawthorne (2002).

[2] Notice, moreover, that recent discussions about immunity to error through misidentification, for instance, proceed by taking for granted that, at least phenomenologically, real memories or quasi-memories (Shoemaker 1970) may be indistinguishable states, insofar as they both deliver the impression, which may be correct or not, that one oneself was F (cf. Coliva 2006, 2012a). So there is actually no need to think of quasi-memories as impersonal (in the way in which Parfit (1984), for instance, does and Shoemaker doesn't). Hence, they could be an expression of a first-person perspective, even on a phenomenological conception of it, just like ordinary memories, and contribute in whatever ways neo-Lockeans may deem fit to the determination of personal identity (cf. Rovane 2012).

[3] This issue is at the core of the section on the self in Coliva 2012b, yet more could, and in my view should be done to clarify it.