Personal Responsibility: Why it Matters

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Alexander Brown, Personal Responsibility: Why it Matters, Continuum, 2009, 214pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847063991.

Reviewed by Marion Smiley, Brandeis University


What should the state do for individuals and what should individuals do for themselves? Alexander Brown claims early on in Personal Responsibility that this is the question that he has placed before himself. Hence, we might expect him to focus equally on both individuals and the state as potential sources of responsibility. But he does not do so. Instead, he focuses primarily on personal responsibility and assumes that the state should be considered responsible for taking care of individuals and providing them with various kinds of goods only when individuals are not able to take care of themselves and when the goods in question, e.g., clean water or safe hospitals, require collective action.

Brown is not averse to the state’s being responsible for the provision of these goods — a kind of responsibility that he calls collective responsibility — in cases where collective action is necessary. Nor does he view collective responsibility as a threat to personal responsibility in these cases. Indeed, he makes clear that

It is wrong to think that there must be either personal responsibility or collective responsibility. If the state sets up and then manages over time a national pension scheme or a system of public health insurance or a special fund to deal with severe flooding or other emergencies, this doesn’t automatically reduce the amount of personal responsibility that ordinary people take for their own lives. On the contrary, collective action can be a way for large numbers of people to take responsibility together. (pp. 16-17)

But things change when it comes to cases in which individuals require state aid because of a deficiency on their part. In these cases, collective responsibility is, from Brown’s perspective, potentially both troublesome and a threat to personal responsibility. Brown’s concern here is primarily with cases in which individuals are disadvantaged as a result of something that they did or failed to do.

What, if anything, should the state, acting on behalf of society, do to help people who can work but who nevertheless prefer to remain idle, who suffer from diseases caused by unhealthy lifestyles, who bear children they cannot afford to care for, who develop alcohol or drug addictions which ruin their lives, or who cultivate tastes for the finer things in life which they fund through unmanageable credit? (p. 1)

In these cases, the state’s financial assistance to individuals does not appear to enhance their personal responsibility. Nor does personal responsibility itself appear to be compatible with collective responsibility. Brown underscores the incompatibility of the two in his treatment of a mother who relies on state assistance to take care of her children. According to Brown, “She is personally responsible for her own child without any assistance from the other biological parent. Nevertheless, she is not fully responsible because she does rely on the state for financial assistance.” (p. 14) (Interestingly enough, Brown treats a mother’s care for her children as personal responsibility even though he defines personal responsibility as “responsibility for oneself”. (p. 15)

Brown’s claim here that reliance on the state is antithetical by definition to personal responsibility is problematic in at least two respects. First of all, he has already claimed that personal responsibility is compatible with reliance on the state in cases involving collective action. (And since his claim here is conceptual rather than empirical, the nature of the particular cases should make no difference.) Second, “reliance on the state” and “personal responsibility” are not opposites in any case. (The opposite of personal responsibility is personal irresponsibility.)

Brown might be able to distinguish between these two kinds of cases by exploring the different kinds of reliance that each involves. (I think that he can do so.) Indeed, he gestures to this possibility himself later on in his analysis when he writes about why social security programs are not a threat to personal responsibility.

Of course, some people maintain that social security is antithetical to real personal responsibility, which they see as a matter of complete independence from government. But this conception of personal responsibility is not particularly widespread in Britain. Most people think of personal responsibility as a matter of not taking a ‘free ride’ on the state. (p. 118)

Brown can presumably make a very strong case for both why taking a ‘free ride’ on the state is a bad — and unfair — kind of reliance and why programs such as social security involve a kind of reliance that both enhances personal responsibility and is fair to others. But he cannot simply assume that one kind of program is unacceptable because it involves reliance on the state and the other is acceptable because it does not. Instead, he has to argue for the acceptability of particular kinds of reliance on the state and the unacceptability of others by making explicit what is wrong with some kinds of reliance and what is right (or at least not wrong) with others.

What about Brown’s analysis of those cases in which individuals bring about their own problems? As things now stand, Brown provides us with a rich array of possible conditions under which individuals might be considered causally responsible for these problems. But he does not spell out why individuals who are causally responsible for their own problems should be responsible for solving these problems, too. Instead, he simply assumes that they are. “If a person is causally responsible for becoming an addict, then he cannot fairly expect our assistance in getting him off drugs.” (p. 151)

At the very least, we have to recognize that there are two different kinds of personal responsibility at work here. One is a practice: namely, that of taking care of oneself. The other is a causal judgment. Brown appears to recognize the differences between the two in places. He defines the first as the practice of making choices for oneself, governing oneself, and relying on oneself: “the opposite of being dependent on others, where being dependent on others means continually looking to others to meet one’s basic needs”. (p. 19) He refers to the second as causal responsibility throughout the book and underscores the consequential analysis that it requires.

But he does not recognize them as two different notions of personal responsibility when he assumes, as he does in the passage quoted above, that causal responsibility for one’s own problems rules out collective responsibility for solving them. Nor does he do so when he establishes what he refers to as the criteria of personal responsibility in general. Indeed, in this context, he conflates the two kinds of personal responsibility and claims that the criteria that he is looking for are "criteria for determining when and how far it is fair to hold persons responsible for their disadvantages and when, in contrast to this, society at large ought to provide assistance." (p. 51, my italics)

Brown may of course be able to provide us with very good reasons for why we should treat causal responsibility for one’s own problems as grounds for insisting that individuals, rather than the state, be responsible for remedying these problems. But he cannot simply assume that one kind of personal responsibility signals the appropriateness of the other because they are both kinds of personal responsibility. Instead, he has to argue for a relationship between them and do so normatively by giving us good reasons for accepting this relationship. In other words, he has to make a case for why individuals, rather than the state, should be responsible for solving problems that individuals have brought about themselves.

Brown does not make such a case here or provide us with a basis for arguing more generally about where to draw the line on collective responsibility. (Instead, he jumps immediately into a discussion of when it is fair to say that individuals are causally responsible for their own problems.) But he does, in his valuation of personal responsibility, signal what such a case might be. Likewise, he does, in his analysis of what philosophers, citizens, and politicians think about personal responsibility, provide us with the beginnings of a very sophisticated, well informed, and refreshingly useful normative framework for arguing among ourselves about how to distribute responsibility across individuals and the state in the cases about which he is concerned.

Brown makes a very persuasive case for why personal responsibility — the practice of taking care of oneself — is important to the development of self-respect and autonomy. Moreover, unlike many others who defend personal responsibility, he does not, in doing so, remain attached to purely individual values. Instead, he opens up the normative terrain of personal responsibility to include a focus on community values such as utility and fairness and fleshes out these values by delving into what various members of the community think about personal responsibility and when it is appropriate.

Brown’s discussion of fairness in this context — whether he is talking about the fairness of giving a liver for purposes of a transplant to an abuser of alcohol rather than to a child or about the fairness of expecting tax payers to foot the bill for those who have gone on a spending spree — is particularly welcome for at least three reasons. First of all, by focusing on fairness, rather than on personal shortcomings, we are much less likely to blame victims. Second, fairness may in the end be the value that is most relevant to matters concerning the state’s responsibility, since it is a political as well as a personal value. Third, as Brown’s own analysis demonstrates very nicely, a focus on fairness allows us to grasp the inter-personal nature of responsibility itself.

Brown’s foray into public opinion here serves him very well. For, by delving into what citizens, politicians, and philosophers think about both personal responsibility itself and how to balance it with collective responsibility, he is able to pick up on aspects of personal responsibility — including its interpersonal nature and its association with fairness — that have not been dealt with extensively by philosophers. Likewise, by underscoring the different opinions expressed in the community about these matters and suggesting what might lie behind them, Brown is able to expand the realm of considerations that we should make when arguing about how to distribute responsibility across individuals and the state.

How — on the basis of what kinds of normative criteria — might we judge the various opinions that get expressed by citizens, politicians, and philosophers? What kinds of institutions might allow us to make normative judgments about personal and collective responsibility in the community? Brown does not provide us with explicit answers to the first question. Nor could he do so without making the kinds of normative arguments that I have suggested above that he has yet to make, i.e. those pertaining to the normative differences between particular kinds of reliance on the state and the relevance of causal responsibility to the appropriateness of personal responsibility.

But he does provide a very intriguing answer to the second question by introducing the practice of citizen juries and then sketching the kinds of work that they might do to balance personal and collective responsibility. The kind of citizen jury that Brown has in mind is both deliberative and policy-oriented:

a small-scale exercise of deliberative democracy in which a group of men and women, jurors, come together to find out more about an issue and try to bring their critical judgment and sense of reasonableness to bear upon that issue, hearing evidence, expressing their views, seeking common ground and drawing up recommendations. (p. 165)

Social and political experience, as well as knowledge of one’s community, becomes very important to what might otherwise appear to be a set of purely ethical arguments about a particular law or policy. For, while citizen jurors reason as individuals, they represent both themselves and particular groups in society. Brown makes clear here that the representation of different groups is necessary for the sake of fairness. “It is important for jurors to represent different groups in society and the conclusions that they reach, which need not be unanimous, should be a fair reflection of the reasoning and values of the population as a whole.” (p. 165)

According to Brown, the purpose of citizen juries is to do what philosophers cannot do on their own, namely, “clarify principles and values that can only be partially described by philosophers or only described in abstract … and broach possible ways of balancing these principles and values.” (p. 164) In the case of controversies concerning personal and collective responsibility, citizen juries could be asked to “think about some of the different moral principles and values associated with personal responsibility that are relevant to policy-making,” as well as “balance these values and principles …and apply them to specific cases” (p. 170).

Brown is probably right that citizen juries can go a long way in identifying important moral controversies and pinpointing the various positions that we can take in these controversies. Likewise, he is probably right that, in doing these things, citizen juries can contribute to both their community and ethical discussions of personal responsibility in ways that philosophers cannot. But how exactly — on the basis of what kind of criteria — are citizen juries supposed to balance values and principles? What is it exactly that they are supposed to argue about when they argue about how to distribute responsibility across individuals and the state?

Brown’s response here is to place faith in citizen juries to answer these questions themselves. But his faith does not appear to be justified. For, while citizen juries may be very well equipped to grasp moral controversies in particular contexts and to inform us about what principles are relevant in these contexts, they need a normative framework for both applying and balancing these principles. In other words, they need criteria — or a set of possible criteria — for making judgments about (in this case) the appropriateness of personal and collective responsibility, criteria that, unlike either the practices of application or judgment, might best be provided by someone in Brown’s position, i.e., an author of an ethical treatise on personal responsibility, rather than citizen juries.

Brown has not, as I have suggested above, provided us with this kind of normative framework himself in Personal Responsibility. But he has provided us with two other things that will unquestionably become very important once we have such a normative framework in place. The first is a rich array of moral perspectives that one could take on personal responsibility (especially with respect to fairness) in particular cases. The second is an institutional framework, citizen juries, for debating these perspectives in public with the kinds of normative criteria that philosophers are perhaps still in the best position — and maybe even obliged — to provide.