Personal Value

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Toni Rønnow-Rasmussen, Personal Value, Oxford University Press, 2011, 185pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199603787.

Reviewed by Mark LeBar, Ohio University


In this work, Rønnow-Rasmussen attempts to expand our taxonomy of kinds of value by distinguishing between personal and impersonal value. To do so, he must offer an analysis of the first (and, by way of it, the second), and then distinguish personal value from other types, familiar from other distinctions among kinds of value, notably: agent-relative vs. agent-neutral value, intrinsic vs. extrinsic value, and final vs. instrumental value. Both in ambition and result, this is an exploratory work. Rønnow-Rasmussen is clear that he himself plans to extend the project, and the book may be seen as an invitation to others to develop and extend the analysis. Overall, however, he makes an excellent case that the idea of personal value is worthy of further study and offers some significant tools for doing so. I learned more, about more different things, in reading this book than I have from any comparable work in some time.

The book falls into three unequal parts. After an introductory chapter, there are seven chapters exploring and developing the idea of personal value, followed by two relatively independent chapters. The first of these challenges the distinction between agent-relative and agent-neutral reasons for action, and a concluding chapter argues against monistic views of the sorts of things that can be thought to bear value. The concluding chapter bears the least on the central project of the book, and I shall say little about it. Instead, I will sketch the key elements of Rønnow-Rasmussen's proposal, offering thoughts about where I found the argument least successful. These are not really objections, as I am largely persuaded by Rønnow-Rasmussen that personal value is a category of value that is both different from and in many ways more interesting than the categories on which much work in axiology is focused.

Examples give a ready intuitive grip on the idea of personal value, and Rønnow-Rasmussen offers two nice ones: a poem written for him by his daughter when she was a child, and remnants of a bookcase his father made for him, now dismantled and showing up in bits in odd places. Contrast the first with a sonnet of Shakespeare's, and the second with an actual working bookcase, and you have the contrast Rønnow-Rasmussen is after. They are valuable to him and (arguably) to no one else -- at least in any sense that does not depend on their value to Rønnow-Rasmussen. We are tempted to say: while they are not good simpliciter, they are good for Rønnow-Rasmussen. It is for that sense of good-forthat Rønnow-Rasmussen offers an analysis.

That analysis, the Fitting Attitude Analysis of Personal value (FAP) looks like this:

FAP: An object x's value for a person a (i.e., x's personal value) consists in the existence of normative reasons for favoring/disfavoring x for a's sake. (47)

Two distinctive elements in this approach merit close attention. First, as a "fitting attitude" (FA) view, it must contend with serious problems that (as Rønnow-Rasmussen acknowledges) such views raise. Second, the "for a's sake" element in the analysis needs explication. What exactly is it to have a reason to do something for someone's sake?

On the first point: FA analyses such as Rønnow-Rasmussen's have their roots (he says) in work by Brentano and Ewing. As a species of what have come to be called "buck-passing" accounts of value, a view of this sort gives priority to the normative over the evaluative, in the sense that it "reduces evaluative claims to deontic claims about attitudes, to the valuable objects in question, that it is fitting to have, or that one ought to have, or that we have reason to have" (24). There are virtues to such approaches, but also well-known drawbacks. Perhaps the most serious of these is the Wrong Kind of Reason (WKR) problem, which Rønnow-Rasmussen himself was partly responsible for bringing to the forefront of contemporary value theory,[1] and to which he devotes a chapter.

WKR problems for FA accounts occur when it looks like it might be fitting to have some attitude toward an object that is the wrong attitude toward that object. For example: a demon threatens you with punishment if you do not admire him (34). While in some sense it would be fitting to comply, one's admiration of the demon would not seem grounded, as intuitively it ought to be, in admirable qualities of the thing admired. Versions of the problem and attempts to solve it have flown thick and fast in recent years. Rønnow-Rasmussen does not offer any solution he thinks puts the problem to bed; here and elsewhere his discussion is marked by a kind of openness and corrigibility which is both refreshing and entirely appropriate for this sort of exploratory work. The approach that he seems to think most nearly works distinguishes what is fitting as a reason for admiring, wanting, or desiring an object from what gives us a reason to have "second-order" attitudes towards those attitudes (39). But this approach requires that we invoke a notion of what is "fitting" or correct as a primitive, and this he is reluctant to do (42). This reluctance I found curious: if the idea of the fitting is really capable of further analysis, as Rønnow-Rasmussen thinks it is (I myself doubt it is), then why use this intermediary concept to offer an analysis of value? Why not cut to the primitives and be done with it?

On the second point: Rønnow-Rasmussen's discussion of what it is to have reason to act for someone's sake puts the spotlight on a notion richly deserving the scrutiny. Chapter 5 is devoted to the topic and develops the theme that the crucial element in personal value is to be found in the kind of attitude one takes to the valued object, although a for-the-sake-of attitude can also figure into the intentional content of an attitude. Somewhat surprisingly, this feature of for-the-sake-of attitudes allows for cases in which "a favors x for its own sake for b's sake" (58). In both the content and the attitude in this case, we have instances of final (as opposed to instrumental) value. Are such compounds problematic? Rønnow-Rasmussen defends this way of understanding the relevant attitudes against competing analyses and cautiously observes that he has found no cases in which this analysis does not seem to work (60).

This tool is crucial in allowing Rønnow-Rasmussen to differentiate his account of personal value from two natural competitors. The first competitor assimilates personal values to agent-relative values, or better, to values that may be analyzed in terms of agent-relative reasons. Rønnow-Rasmussen offers two reasons for not doing so. The first is that the focus on for-the-sake-of attitudes does a much better job than does the agent-relative scheme in drawing our attention to the kind of attitude involved in cases of personal value. The second reason is that Rønnow-Rasmussen is skeptical of the agent-relative/agent-neutral distinction among reasons in the first place. Chapter 9 is devoted to an extended argument that it is hard to see why any reasons are not agent-relative, since "all reasons are reasons for someone" (132). Rønnow-Rasmussen makes such strong claims about this point (it is "mystical" (139) and "incomprehensible" (141) how things could be otherwise) that it begs for an error theory explaining why so many have felt it manifest that there are agent-neutral reasons. Of course, if there are none and the distinction itself is defective, agent-relativity will offer little help in marking the distinction between personal and impersonal value Rønnow-Rasmussen wants. It is hard to imagine that this chapter will not become a lightning-rod for discussion of the agent-relative/agent-neutral distinction.

The second competitor ties personal value tightly to welfare or well-being, and here too Rønnow-Rasmussen urges resistance. The case of his daughter's poem provides an intuitive basis for thinking something could have personal value while not contributing to welfare, but things are not quite that simple, because welfare has an uncertain relation with good-for. And Rønnow-Rasmussen cannot quite decide whether or not his account of personal value is a "new analysis" of good-for (suggesting that it is, on p. 169, and yet conceding that there may be relevant uses of good-for that his analysis does not capture, a page later). Rønnow-Rasmussen's treatment of the relation between welfare and good-for (Chapter 7) is quite illuminating, but overall there is still murk in how we are to understand the relations between these concepts. (And I doubt Rønnow-Rasmussen would disagree.)

This brings me to my largest concern about Rønnow-Rasmussen's undertaking, which is to some degree methodological. It does seem as though he is firmly committed to a project of conceptual analysis, and he emphasizes repeatedly that he wants his work to remain at a formal level of analysis that does not precommit him (or others who accept the analysis) to substantive views, e.g., on what actually might have personal value. It is easy to see why he would maintain this methodological goal, and the more nearly he can achieve it, the more powerful his analysis will be.

Yet there are several reasons for being skeptical that it can be achieved to anything like the degree he aspires to. Consider, for starters, that the WKR problem -- a central issue with which any FA account (and thus his analysis) must contend -- is rooted in substantive value judgments, about the kinds of things that are valuable and the kinds of value they have. So far as I can see, there just is no engaging the WKR problem without making substantive commitments on such issues, if not more generally on questions of valuemakers (what makes things have values of various sorts).

A second reason for skepticism is provided by the complexities of Rønnow-Rasmussen's discussion of the relation between good-for and welfare. As he observes, what one thinks of this relation will be largely influenced (if not determined) by one's conception -- that is, one's substantive views -- of (i) welfare and (ii) good-for.[2] Now add in the uncertain relations between either of these and personal value (leave aside agent-relative value, if there is such a thing), and the relations between these concepts will, it seems, become bewilderingly complex if we are not tracking the implications of specific conceptions of each.

Finally, it seems to me quite natural to suppose that our concepts change and mature as a result of improvements in our corresponding conceptions. Our concept element cannot be what it was for those without the benefit of modern chemistry, nor of whale the same as that of those unable to distinguish between mammal and fish. Maybe we really are not making any progress at all in our substantive understanding of value, but if we are, why suppose that we cannot make use of substantive insights to enhance our understandings of value concepts?

This is really a quibble, though, with a provocative and stimulating work. Rønnow-Rasmussen is engaging cutting-edge views and novel questions in value theory, and this means this is not a book for the uninitiated. It is not suitable, for example, for a survey course in value theory, though it will, I expect, provide excellent fodder for more than one seminar. It will not be -- and Rønnow-Rasmussen does not pretend it will be -- the last word on personal value. But as a first word it is a firecracker.[3]

[1] Rabinowicz, Wlodek and Rønnow-Rasmussen, Toni. 2004."The Strike of the Demon: On Fitting Pro-Attitudes and Value," Ethics 114, pp. 291-423.

[2] Rønnow-Rasmussen frames this as a matter of whether or not one takes the respective concepts to be "thick" (with non-evaluative content) or "thin" (p. 106). But I take that point to be largely a reflection of substantive views -- conceptions of these concepts.

[3] Thanks to Nathaniel Goldberg and Daniel Russell for comments on earlier drafts of this review.