Persons and Passions: Essays in Honor of Annette Baier

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Joyce Jenkins, Jennifer Whiting, and Christopher Williams, (eds.), Persons and Passions: Essays in Honor of Annette Baier, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 376pp, $53.00 (hbk), ISBN 0268032637.

Reviewed by Elizabeth S. Radcliffe, Santa Clara University


The renowned philosopher Annette Baier has written on an array of topics in her distinguished career, including moral philosophy, feminism, justice, virtue, rights, trust, passion, and reason. She is probably best known for her work on Hume, but Descartes and Kant have also received attention in her philosophical discussions. The fifteen essays, plus introduction, in this attractive volume appear as a fitting tribute to Baier and her work, and many are written by former students or former colleagues. All of the articles discuss human emotions -- either their apparent opposition to reason, or the role of the emotions in morality and human relationships. Christopher Williams tells us in his helpful introduction that the "master theme" of the book is Baier's naturalism, which, he explains, is not so readily understandable without some guidance. Williams conceives of the naturalism in Baier's philosophy in terms of Baier's taking the natural history, emotional constitution, and biology of the human being as the ground for explaining and justifying human beliefs and value judgments. One can characterize these papers as on four topics, broadly speaking: Descartes, especially Descartes and the passions; Hume and the passions, morality, and the self; Kant's morality; and trust. Aristotle gets some attention in two of them as well. These contributions do an admirable job of carrying through on the naturalistic theme, although some of them are simply on topics Baier appreciates, while others are clearly written with Baier's work in mind. With the exception of one and part of another, all of the essays are never before published. Their caliber is uniformly high. (Invited collections are not always filled with such quality.) I will mention all the contributions, but can only discuss some of them.

Descartes and the Passions.

The first three essays aim to show that the passions and the intellect are not opposed in Descartes' philosophy. In "What are the Passions Doing in the Meditations?" Lisa Shapiro asks why Descartes' meditator, whose essence is intellect, expresses desire, wonder, amazement, and confidence, among other emotions. Are the references to these passions philosophically significant? Shapiro argues that the passions are consequential to the Meditations insofar as Descartes' project includes more than answering skepticism; it also involves regulation of the passions, especially the passion for certainty about everything. Shapiro makes an interesting connection between this goal of passionate regulation and our free will: To use free will well requires that we not desire things outside of our suitable jurisdiction. Consequently, it becomes an important goal of the meditator to transform the desire for certainty into a desire to have certainty about only what can be known. Shapiro's essay is consonant with a notion that Williams in his introduction attributes to Baier's naturalism: the importance of self-correction of our judgments by our emotions.

William Beardsley next argues in "Love in the Ruins: Passion in Descartes' Meditations" for the surprising thesis that both intellectual and passionate love, as described by Descartes, have roles to play in the clarification of perception in the Meditations. Intellectual love is the thought of something as good and as part of a whole with oneself; passionate love is the confused thought by which one joins with the object of one's love. For Descartes, a perception is made more distinct when we strip away features that do not properly belong to it; it is made clearer the more qualities we properly include in its content. Beardsley argues that, in Meditation V, passionate love aids the meditator in gaining clarity of perception. As the thinker incorporates more properties into her perception, increasing clarity, she is considering the properties as part of an inferential system united with her soul: This is the work of intellectual love. But it is the passionate love of God, Beardsley maintains, that has the meditator consider self in relation to God in such a way that she is compelled to assent to the patterns of inference God has ordained in the universe. One remarkable implication of Beardsley's view is that confused thoughts of God (passionate love) contribute to the achievement of clarity and distinctness in the meditator's thoughts of the world.

Amy Schmitter's contribution, "The Passionate Intellect: Reading the (Non-)Opposition of Reason and Emotions in Descartes," is a lively paper offering a feminist critique of Descartes interpreters who have suggested that the distinction between mind and body is to be read as an opposition of reason and emotion. Schmitter's essay begins with an interesting account of Baier's method of reading philosophical texts (dubbed "reading like a girl") and concludes with a provocative section on the special role and aims of feminist critique in interpreting philosophical texts. Schmitter writes, "The question we face … is to what extent the reading against the grain demanded by feminist critical goals might come into conflict with fairness to the work of a (long-dead) individual" (67). Schmitter argues that such critique can be engaged to unearth certain ideologies unconsciously buried in our philosophical method and to release us from them. Even those who want to regard feminism as yet another ideology by which some want to re-read the history of philosophy will find what Schmitter has to say here worth their attention.

The last of the Cartesian essays is Cecelia Wee's "Material Falsity and the Arguments for God's Existence in Descartes' Meditations," a discussion that follows Baier's method of interpreting Meditation III in the context of the earlier two meditations.

Hume and the Sentiments.

Saul Traiger's and Lilli Alanen's essays each deal with puzzling aspects of the relation between passions and reflection in Hume. For Traiger, the issue in "Reason Unhinged: Passion and Precipice from Montaigne to Hume" is how Hume avoids a conclusion that Montaigne and Pascal drew concerning the inability of reason at times to overcome the influence of fear in belief formation. A well known case in the history of philosophy is the wise person safely supported, but looking into a precipice and believing he or she will fall. Some of Hume's predecessors use the example to conclude that affective mechanisms can make it impossible to hold beliefs we would have arrived at through causal reasoning. Traiger attempts to explain how Hume avoids their skeptical conclusion by appealing to what Traiger calls Hume's "shared arena" for reason, passion, and imagination. While reason cannot oppose passion on Hume's view, Traiger argues that reflection on past experiences, along with second-order reflection on the effects of imagination and passion on our ideas, lead to a correction of our fear of falling. His is a provocative discussion, but I wonder about the shared arena in which Traiger (following Passmore and Baier, I take it) portrays beliefs, the products of reason, as sentiments alongside passions. Beliefs are ideas for Hume, and insofar as they are the most vivacious of our ideas, they have a phenomenal aspect, as do all perceptions; but beliefs are also representations. Do Humean sentiments represent? Traiger says that in the precipice case, "reflection corrects the fear of falling," but I would want to ask whether reflection can be said to correct passion for Hume, or whether it corrects the belief the passion influences.

Alanen's essay, "Reflection and Idea in Hume's Account of the Passions," offers a detailed analysis of the role of reflection in the production of the passions, which are defined by Hume as "impressions of reflexion." The key question of the paper is one that has troubled Baier as well: Why does Hume assert that passions "do not contain any representational quality," when the passions do seem to have objects? In the case of the indirect passions of pride, humility, love, and hatred, the intentional character is explicit in Hume's own analysis: I'm proud of my cooking; I love my spouse, and so on. Alanen attempts to reconcile the two characterizations of passions for Hume by offering, she says, a conception of intentionality -- inspired by Baier -- "which is broader than one that construes intentionality in terms of propositional attitudes." I think what she offers in the end is an insightful explanation why Hume wrote what he did about the passions, but it does not succeed at reconciling the diverse characterizations. I doubt Alanen thinks it does either, since she concludes by noting that many of the claims in Hume's philosophy of mind, including his suggestions about the intentionality of the passions, simply do not fit his own division between matters of fact and relations of ideas.

Janet Broughton's contribution, "Hume's Voyage," is a critical study of Baier's treatment of Book I of the Treatise in her book, A Progress of Sentiments. Broughton calls much of Baier's analysis of Book I "novel and persuasive," but questions whether Hume's voyage there is rightly called a progress, contending that Baier offers a much more optimistic interpretation of Hume's conclusions than Broughton thinks is warranted. Baier sees Hume in Parts 1-3 of Book I as developing a sentimentalist theory of the understanding (a theory that makes custom, association, and the "feeling" dimension of perception central). Then she interprets the skepticism of Part 4 as Hume's taking up the perspective of the Cartesian intellect, engaged in a highly intellectual reflection on the intellect itself. The process leads to devastating results, such as the impossibility of believing in the existence of a world of matter. Baier contends that this is Hume's reductio of an alternate viewpoint and endorsement of the sentimentalist theory. Broughton offers contrary evidence, reaching a dramatically different conclusion: that the result of Hume's investigation into the understanding is that it "operates according to principles -- those developed in the sentimentalist theory -- that make reasonable belief in almost anything impossible" (188). Baier and Hume critics will need to consider seriously Broughton's persuasive arguments.

The other essays on Hume, which I haven't the room to discuss, deserve careful reading as well: Donald Ainslie, "Sympathy and the Unity of Hume's Idea of Self"; Alasdair Macintyre, "Artifice, Design, and their Relationship: Hume against Aristotle"; David Gauthier, "Hume and Morality's 'Useful Purpose'"; and Robert Shaver, "Reflection and Well-Being".

Kant's Morality.

It is no secret that Annette Baier has been critical of Kant's moral system for its inattention to human nature. In his essay, "Friendship and the Law of Reason: Baier and Kant on Love and Principles," Sergio Tenenbaum defends Kant against some of Baier's objections to Kant's characterization of friendship. However, I want to focus on Michelle Moody-Adams's essay. Moody-Adams questions Baier's defense of Hume against Kant on the immorality of cruelty in "Cruelty, Respect, and Unsentimental Love." Baier has argued that Hume's objections to cruelty fare better than Kant's because Hume makes cruelty from anger or hatred the worst vice. Moody-Adams replies here that the cruelty perpetrated out of sadistic pleasure is equally reprehensible, and that Hume's account has nothing to say about it. Moody-Adams is also disturbed by Hume's emphasis on the harm cruelty does to the perpetrator, rendering him or her "incommodious" to those with whom the agent must socialize, when the immorality of cruelty lies most crucially in the impact on those who endure it. Kant's theory offers a better analysis of the wrongness of cruelty, Moody-Adams argues, by explaining its immorality in terms of the devaluation of another by using him or her as a mere means to an end. Furthermore, Moody-Adams writes: "Hume's conception of morality provides no firm ground for understanding, and then condemning, the moral wrong of extreme institutionalized cruelty. Yet it is with respect to such matters that the strengths of Kant's conception are most obvious" (296). Her conclusion is based on the fact that while Hume says that sympathy is the basis of our moral judgments, he admits that it cannot extend far enough to ground disapproval of certain practices affecting strangers and those remote from us.

Moody-Adams's arguments are important ones, but I think Baier will remain unconvinced. Baier can reply, for instance, that Hume's moral theory has the resources to condemn cruelty from motives besides anger or hatred and that it takes as the very sign of corrupt motives, whatever they might be, the distress inflicted on the victims of cruelty. Our disapprovals are provoked by our witnessing the effects of the actions on the people involved, so consequences for the victims are important. Hume may fare less well on the institutional injustice front. The question Moody-Adams raises here is a serious one for Hume: What is the mechanism in human nature that moves us to ferret out practices that are naturally vicious, but are seen as in the interest of the community and entrenched in social practices? Can Hume allow that our natural sympathies reach to those who suffer from such an arrangement?


The final two essays in this volume take inspiration from Annette Baier's writings on trust. Karen Jones's essay, "Trust as an Affective Attitude" (published in Ethics in 1996) argues for a conception of trust that makes its defining feature an affective stance toward the one trusted. The volume concludes with a unique essay authored by Jennifer Whiting, written for a conference on the occasion of Annette Baier's retirement in 1995. In "Trusting 'First' and 'Second' Selves: Aristotelian Reflections on Virginia Woolf and Annette Baier," Whiting takes as her inspiration a suggestion of Baier's, made in the context of a discussion of Aristotle, that one cannot have as a friend, a "second self," a person one does not trust. While Whiting agrees that this is so for Aristotle, who has an idealized conception of virtue, she explores whether, on a more realistic picture of virtuous friends, Baier's thesis must hold. Whiting suggests that, at times, distrust of "first self" is appropriate; for instance, I should suspect that some of my own beliefs and attitudes are erroneous and want a check on them. If I and my friends subscribe to a certain paradigm, or are members of the same dominant or subordinate social group, we might very well succumb to the same prejudices and distortions. Distrust of second self, then, is also warranted.

Whiting's essay takes us on a journey of sorts, through the thoughts of feminist writer Virginia Woolf, whom Whiting thinks makes a compelling case for self-distrust. She also discusses the professional life and attitudes of Annette Baier, asking the question whether Woolf, who advocates that women never leave their four traditional teachers, "poverty chastity, derision and freedom from unreal loyalties" (339), would have approved of Baier, who has not taken this advice. I'm not sure that Whiting succeeds in tying together all of the diverse strands of her essay, but it's an intriguing read and a fitting conclusion to the volume.

I highly recommend these essays to anyone with interests in the passions in seventeenth and eighteenth century philosophy, in the virtues, or in Annette Baier's ideas and their influence. I would have appreciated a bibliography of Annette Baier's works appended to the volume. Nonetheless, this is perhaps as useful and agreeable a volume as one might hope to produce in honor of a venerated scholar who is also a beloved mentor, colleague, and friend.