Persons, Animals, Ourselves

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Paul F. Snowdon, Persons, Animals, Ourselves, Oxford University Press, 2014, 260pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198719618.

Reviewed by Eric T. Olson, University of Sheffield


Paul Snowdon is a gentle, nonconfrontational philosopher. He doesn't try to show that our views are incoherent, or to change our minds with powerful arguments, or to frighten us in any other way. His approach is to show that our deepest convictions fit better with simple and homely views than with their more exciting rivals, however fashionable they may be. He wants to talk us calmly down from the high ledge to something safe and sensible. His thinking is conservative in the best sense of the word: calm, cautious, and distrustful of radical departures from what we thought before we took up philosophy. It's a refreshing change from the usual literature on personal identity.

Snowdon's book is a defense of "animalism", the view that you and I are animals. Most philosophers see animalism not as safe and sensible but as a daring innovation, strongly opposed to our ordinary beliefs and supported only by difficult metaphysical arguments. Snowdon thinks this is the opposite of the truth. He sets difficult metaphysics aside and tries to show that, for the most part, our ordinary thinking favors animalism.

He begins (after three rather slow preliminary chapters) by arguing that animalism is "the default position". It is overwhelmingly how things appear on the face of it. There certainly are human animals. Each of us appears to have the shape and size and physical properties of such an animal. And we think of ourselves as animals, albeit special ones. We rarely think of ourselves as nonanimals. (There is evidence that we have an innate tendency to believe in life after death. But to believe that we have life after death is not to deny that we are animals. The two claims may even be compatible.) Snowdon infers from this that we are entitled to believe without argument that we are animals, much as we are entitled to believe without argument that time is real and that there are material things independent of our perception of them. By contrast, we are not entitled to believe without argument that we are nonanimals.

We might wonder whether there is such a thing as the default position here. There must be philosophical claims that we are entitled to accept without argument -- otherwise we should never be entitled to accept any such claim as a premise -- and animalism is a strong candidate for being one. But might not some rival to animalism have the same status? It used to be alleged that atheism was the default position on the question of God's existence: you can deny theism without doing any work, but affirming it requires positive evidence. Since then, many philosophers have argued that theism, too, can be accepted without positive evidence. Whatever the strength of those arguments, we no longer hear that atheism is the default position, and "the presumption of atheism" has been relegated to the dusty shelves of the library basement. But if there is not obviously a unique default position on the existence of God, why must there be a default position on what we are?

Yet Snowdon's claim is quite plausible. Consider the main alternatives to animalism. We might be immaterial substances. We might be bundles of mental events -- that is, immaterial nonsubstances. We might be spatial or temporal parts of animals: brains, perhaps, or temporal parts of brains. Or we might be nonanimals made of the same matter as animals and physically identical to them, but with different modal properties. There are arguments for each of these views. But could we be entitled to accept one of them without argument because that is how things appear before the arguments are given? Compared to these, animalism is gray and respectable -- boring, almost. Its reputation for being tough-minded and revisionist is due only to the fact that professional philosophers have been led away from it by complex arguments. It looks like the candidate to beat.

If animalism really is the default position, the main question is whether the arguments against it are strong enough to overturn the presumption in its favor. Most of the book is devoted to showing that they are not. The most common of these arguments try to show that animalism has unacceptable consequences in "puzzle cases": stories where animalism and its rivals give different verdicts on who is who. What Snowdon does best, and does better than anyone else, is think about these cases in a vivid and realistic way that makes the usual discussions of them look shallow.

For instance, it is commonly argued that we are essentially people (or persons) in something like Locke's sense: we could not exist without being rational and able to think about ourselves as persisting through time. Since no animal is essentially a person in this sense, it would follow that we are not animals: we should have a property that no animal has, namely being a Lockean person essentially.

Why think we have this property? The usual answer is that permanently losing those mental capacities that make you a person looks like the end of you. Snowdon has us think again. Imagine your reaction if a parent or grandparent got a bad case of senile dementia. You might reasonably wonder whether she would get any benefit from a visit. But would you decline to go on the grounds that no inmate of the nursing home was any relation of yours? Would you say that you had been unable to see your relative because she wasn't there? If she were in agony, would it be the same as if an elderly patient unrelated to you were in agony?

Or consider that parents of disabled children who never attain Lockean personhood don't think of them as belonging to a different category of thing from their normal children. And if some new treatment could enable them to acquire normal mental capacities, everyone would see this as a wonderful thing for those children. Yet according to the anti-animalist argument, the new treatment could not possibly benefit them, but could only bring new children into existence. For that matter, we all think of ourselves as having once been in our mother's womb. Lockean personhood appears to be a property we acquire, and thus not one that we have essentially.

Another frequent claim is that multiple-personality disorder can "fracture" someone into a number of new people, none of which is the original. The animal would then outlive the person. Since nothing could outlive itself, it would follow that none of us is an animal. Snowdon again imagines this happening to a loved one. "Is there really any appeal at all," he asks, "in thinking that the person who means so much to you is literally no longer there, rather than so obviously there and suffering?" (153).

The best-known objection to animalism imagines your brain transplanted into my head, so that the resulting being has your memories and other psychological features and not mine. The orthodox view is that he would clearly be you -- as he would think he was. Yet the operation would not move an animal from your head to mine, but simply deprive it of an organ. So you, but not the animal, are such that you would go with your brain if it were transplanted. Since this would hold for all of us, it would follow once again that none of us were animals.

In this case Snowdon does not try to show that careful reflection on the story is consistent with animalism. He argues only that the "transplant intuition" is less certain than it's taken to be. Suppose you had an illness that would kill you unless your brain was replaced with a healthy donated organ. This would of course destroy your memories and cognitive skills. It may not be clear whether you could survive such a thing. But it's not obvious that you couldn't survive it either. Maybe the operation could save your life, though at great cost. And it makes little difference if we suppose that the new brain comes with memories from the donor. But if it's not obvious that the brain recipient would not be you, then it's not obvious that it would be the donor, and thus not obvious that a person must go with her transplanted brain.

The discussion of cases like these is the most successful part of the book, and there is much to learn from it. But in the attempt to reassure us, Snowdon goes on to make the bold claim that animalism fits well with almost any general metaphysical view. This includes temporal-parts and constitution views, generally seen as antithetical to animalism. Snowdon wants to be ecumenical and welcome all metaphysical faiths into his tent: this is another example of his nonconfrontational style. In fact he is attracted to the view that each ordinary material thing is "constituted by" another thing physically identical to it but with different modal properties. He says little about this, but it's an important point.

It would mean that we each now share our matter with a lump of flesh that is not an organism, just as a clay statue coincides with a lump of clay that is not a statue. Most constitutionalists take this to imply that a human animal coincides with a third thing as well, one that is a Lockean person essentially and would go with its transplanted brain. It would have all the mental properties that the animal has (as would the lump, if the mental supervenes on the physical). This is the very problem of "too many thinkers" that animalism is usually taken to avoid. This apparent virtue is the basis of the most common argument for animalism: the animal thinks, but I'm not one of two thinkers here; so I must be the animal. Snowdon's ecumenicalism deprives him of this reasoning and forces him to fight on his enemies' territory, by wrangling over puzzle cases.

Snowdon is more or less unique among animalists in granting the existence of the beings that their opponents take us to be. He happily concedes that each of us shares our thoughts with at least one nonanimal, and probably more. How am I to know that I'm the thinking animal, and not the thinking lump of flesh or the essential Lockean person? Mustn't all but one of those beings be mistaken about what they are? How do I know I'm not one of them? Snowdon's answer is that when the essential Lockean person or one of the others thinks or speaks in the first person, it does not refer to itself, but rather to the animal coinciding with it. Since I am trivially the being I refer to when I say or think "I", this enables me to know that I am the animal rather than one of the other thinkers of my thoughts.

This is the opposite of what animalism's opponents say: they claim that the animal's first-person thoughts (if it can think at all) refer not to itself, but to the essential Lockean person. This is because they take our attitudes to the puzzle cases to reflect the conviction that we are essentially Lockean people and that we should go with our transplanted brains. And it is these attitudes, they say, that determine the reference of first-person thought and the personal pronouns. Snowdon accepts that these attitudes determine the reference, but thinks they reflect the conviction that we are animals rather than essential Lockean people.

Here I think he overstates his case. I doubt whether our attitudes to the puzzle cases are precise or consistent enough to fix our "personal" reference to any unique sort of candidate. If there really are many different beings thinking our thoughts, and the reference of those thoughts really is determined by our attitudes, this reference is likely to be indeterminate. Sometimes, at least, our thoughts will not definitely refer to an animal, but not definitely refer to a nonanimal either, but refer ambiguously to both.

So if we ask what we are -- that is, what we refer to when we say "I" -- there will be no definite answer. We're not definitely animals, yet not definitely not animals either. This is not because any single being is neither definitely an animal nor definitely not an animal, but because the personal pronouns are indeterminate in their reference: they "sort of" refer to things that are definitely animals, and "sort of" refer to things that are definitely not animals. Likewise, it will be indeterminate what would happen to me if my brain were transplanted. Again, this is not because the fate of any single being would be indeterminate, but because of semantic indeterminacy: one of the beings my question sort of refers to would go with the brain, and another would stay behind with an empty head. It follows that neither animalism nor its negation is definitely true. Snowdon's ecumenicalism appears to make the debate between animalism and its rivals a stalemate -- not because the arguments are equally strong, but because both views are equally correct.

Even if there is no indeterminacy of reference and animalism is true for Snowdon's reasons, this will be a less important fact than most of us thought it was. Snowdon's ecumenicalism makes the question of whether we are animals a purely semantic one. Both animalists and their opponents can agree about the metaphysical facts: the existence, mental properties, persistence conditions, and modal properties of human animals and of the various beings coinciding with them. They disagree only about which of these things our words and thoughts refer to. It's hard to see how these semantic facts could have any ethical significance, or why we should care much what they are.

Few parties to the personal-identity debates will find this cheering. Even those who dislike metaphysics and are suspicious of the debates will be happy only until they realize that the important question now is whether the constitution view or the ontology of temporal parts or the like is true -- that is, whether there really are nonanimals thinking our thoughts. Snowdon's desire to please everyone puts him at risk of pleasing no one.