Persons: Human and Divine

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Peter van Inwagen and Dean Zimmerman (eds.), Persons: Human and Divine, Oxford University Press, 2007, 380pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199277513.

Reviewed by William R. Carter, North Carolina State University


I once knew a philosopher who claimed to lose sleep over the following question: What should (we) philosophers turn to when all philosophical problems have been resolved? Not to worry, at least in the foreseeable future. The metaphysical questions posed in this book promise to keep us occupied for some time. The papers that make up the book are generally of high quality -- some more so than others. There's much here that deserves close study. A number of the contributions are strikingly adventurous. A close reading of Persons might encourage the depressing thought that few, if any, metaphysical issues can be finally resolved. One response to this is a meek but straightforward, 'So what?'. Perhaps there is something to this, since it is widely agreed that, contrary to verificationists, many legitimate questions lack answers that are, or that promise someday to be, demonstrably true. (Contemporary physics is heavy with such questions.) But of course there is an alternative to the meek response. A bold -- markedly less defeatist -- position is that there are good, if perhaps not conclusive, reasons to accept certain adventurous metaphysical propositions. There's a strong flavor of this bold response in many of the papers that make up Persons. The book does not lack for intricate and often original arguments that speak for (or in some cases against) what some will regard as 'unverifiable' or 'undecidable' claims. If there is reason to judge that any such argument is sound, then presumably there will be prospects for resolving some metaphysical questions. Declarations of sweeping defeatism that precede examination of the relevant arguments are not to be taken seriously. It won't do to dismiss the arguments on the grounds that the conclusions fail to be 'decidable' propositions. (Those engaged in such argumentation reject such defeatism.) I'll raise some problems for some of these arguments in what follows. But first something needs to be said about the contents of Persons. Here's a short list of some eye-catching claims made by contributors to the book:

(1) Idealism (some version of idealism) is true. The only intrinsic properties of substantial things are 'qualities of consciousness' (Robert Adams).

(2) There are two different kinds of time. We exist (the self exists) in one sort of time, though not in another sort of time (Howard Robinson).

(3) There is a rational reconstruction of Descartes's position that is widely overlooked by frivolous dismissals of Cartesian metaphysics. The reconstructed Cartesian position is no push-over (John Hawthorne).

(4) If materialism were true, then there wouldn't be any mental activity (Alvin Plantinga).

(5) Property dualism is true, as is substance dualism (Richard Swinburne).

(6) Disembodied subjects might well have a temperature and so be 'sources of radiant heat' (W. D. Hart and Takashi Yagisawa).

(7) The fact of 'metabolic turnover' on the part of our bodies poses hard questions for Cartesian interactionists (Hong Yu Wong).

(8) There are no events. There are substances and properties, but there are no changes. (Peter van Inwagen).

(9) We are not human animals; human persons are not human animals (Hud Hudson).

(10) The horror we feel at cannibalism lacks objective validity. The horror we feel at sexual violations has such validity (Philip Quinn).

(11) Constitutional assessments of the body/person relation are compatible with traditional theism (Lynne Rudder Baker).

(12) The doctrine of Incarnation poses a threat to substance dualism (Trenton Merricks).

(13) We inhabit a branching universe; death is an illusion. Dead people wind up on branches other than the branches occupied by living people (Peter Forrest).

(14) There is a 'divine command theory of persistence' that makes 'original sin' a sensible doctrine (Michael Rea).

(15) There are 'temporary identities'. Such identities are both compatible with Leibniz's Law and useful when we ask how God 'can be three divine persons' (Brian Leftow).

This review can't address all of these claims (much less the supporting arguments). I'll make some very brief remarks concerning the papers by Adams, Robinson, Swinburne, Rea and Leftow. A word at the outset about Christianity and metaphysics. We are told that, with two exceptions, the various contributors to Persons strongly identify with the Christian theological tradition:

Although numerous outspoken Christians are highly respected in analytic circles, many of our colleagues still regard the persistence of religious belief among otherwise intelligent philosophers as a strange aberration, a pocket of irrationality (Dean Zimmerman, p. 12).

That's true. (It's true that many of the contributors to Persons are highly respected analytic philosophers; it’s also true that there are perceptions of pockets of irrationality.) But with one or two exceptions, the papers in the book say very little about Christian theology. Some of the contributors defend, and others reject, dualism. Plantinga's thesis that Christian philosophers should be dualists (p. 100) is contested. (It would have been nice to have a paper addressed to the issue. How radically must Christianity be revised, if indeed it needs to be revised at all, given a materialistic view of the world?) Of course we should all be dualists, if there's a sound argument in behalf of dualism. We might believe that Swinburne's contribution to Persons constitutes such an argument. I'll question this in what follows.

Zimmerman encourages tolerance on the part of metaphysicians when it comes to 'crazy' views (p. 11). Some contemporary philosophers take idealism to be, if not crazy, a thesis that needs to earn respect. Robert Adams presents an elaborate and thoughtful 'vindication' of idealism. I take the key premise of the argument to be that the reality of a substance must include something that is intrinsic and qualitative (p. 40). Folk ontology postulates a realm of mind-independent 'material' things such as the oak tree outside my window. But if the tree's alleged qualitative features turn out to be what are called 'secondary qualities' located in our minds (or in some supernatural mind), the tree is not (intrinsically) possessed of such features. Either 'the tree' is not real or (if it is) it is qualitative and so mind-dependent.

The intuitively compelling point … is that a system of spatiotemporal relationships constituted by sizes, shapes, positions, and changes thereof is too incomplete, too hollow, as it were, to constitute an ultimately real thing or substance (p. 40).

Stripped of its qualitative properties, my tree is nothing more than such a system of relationships; metaphysically speaking, the tree is distressingly 'hollow' -- not a substantial thing. That points in the direction of an eliminativist position with respect to folk objects. So it's natural to ask -- do we exist? One affirmative answer to this says that we are (immaterial) minds. Do immaterial things have qualitative properties? A negative answer to the second question suggests that either we don't escape the eliminativist's net or (if we do) idealists are mistaken in judging that, as a matter of necessity, existing things have such properties. Adams tells us that the mind itself is not blue or sweet-flavored (p. 41). If we are minds, then we are challenged (as trees and tractors are) with respect to qualitative properties. We don't exist.

But let's allow that we do exist. Suppose also, as Howard Robinson does, that we (selves) are essentially conscious. We exist at all, and only, times at which we are conscious. Arguably that has the corollary that we exist intermittently. (That assumes that we exist when we are awake, though not when we are asleep.) Robinson is not a friend of intermittent existence. But if, as he proposes, time is not a monolithic entity (p. 56), then perhaps we are located in one sort of time though not in another sort of time. Presumably we don't exist intermittently in time-order T in the event that are we are not located in T-time. Supposing that we are located neither in 'manifest image time' (MIT) or in 'scientific image time' (SIT), as Robinson argues (p. 58), there can be no MIT or SIT intermittent existence on our part. However, it seems that temporal beings must exist in some sort of time (in some temporal order). Unless we are atemporal beings -- things that don't 'exist in time' at all -- it seems (given the essentialist assumption) that we are located in some sort of time wherein we exist intermittently. To banish intermittent existence from all temporal orders is to invite a dismissal of the claim that we are essentially conscious.

Temporal idealism says that time exists only in the mind and that encourages the thought that we somehow construct MIT and so are not ourselves located in MIT. If the passage or 'flow' of time is a feature only of MIT, then we are not caught up in temporal passage. Eternalists will welcome this conclusion, declaring that we exist simpliciter insofar as we are constituents of a four-dimensional (blockish) space-time universe. Suppose that SIT is a no-flow (eternalist) conception of time. If we are located only in SIT, then perhaps our alleged intermittent existence is unobjectionable (amounting only to multiple occupancy of spacetime regions that are gappy in certain respects). The worry here is that SIT has no place for immaterial beings (p. 59). (SIT is populated by all and only material beings, and no such being is essentially conscious; no material thing has the status of a self.) Assuming that we persist only in temporal orders in which we are located, we have no claim to SIT-persistence. Moreover, it appears that we lack MIT-persistence. MIT is a construct of our experiences, which means that we do not strictly exist in MIT (p. 75). On Robinson's assumptions, it seems that we don't persist at all (in any temporal order). If (as Sally Haslanger suggests) it's a Moorean fact that we do persist, then there is reason to question these assumptions.

Swinburne argues that we are pure mental substances (p. 162). But he would not endorse the following argument:

If p is conceivable, then p is logically and so metaphysically possible. It is conceivable that we are not material beings, and so M-possible that we are such beings. Since material beings are necessarily material, it follows that we are not material beings.

The step from logical (L-) possibility to metaphysical (M-) possibility is widely challenged. The heart of Swinburne's case for dualism is that the inference from L- to M-possibility is legitimate when we have a full description of the world or 'the whole story of the world' (pp. 152 and 147). Obviously this doesn't advance matters if it turns out that we are in no position to give anything like the whole story of the world. Oddly, Swinburne seems to agree that we don't have the whole story. We are told that:

A full description of a world will include descriptions of its events in terms of informative designators (p. 147).

We also are told that we do not have informative designators (IDs hereafter) for many substances (p. 156). We thus are in no position to tell the whole story of the world, and so in no position to declare that inferences from L-possibility to M-possibility are valid. One reply to this says that we can at least tell the whole story about the part of the world consisting of ourselves. We have (it is asserted) self-IDs. I think that should be questioned. Consider:

For a rigid designator of a thing to be an informative designator it must be the case that someone who knows what this word means … knows a certain set of conditions necessary and sufficient (in any possible world) for a thing to be that thing … (p. 146).

One might say that the condition of 'being this person' or 'being the person I am' is necessary and sufficient for a thing to be me; my self-ID is simply 'being the person I am'. But of course that doesn't amount to anything remotely like an informative self-ID. Presumably an informative full description of the small part of the world consisting of us requires informative IDs, and is isn't clear (to say the least) that such IDs are available.

Consider this argument supportive of idealism:

It's conceivable that the tree outside my study window is nothing more than a collection of ideas and sensations.[1] That's conceivable and so logically possible. Since there is an idealist-friendly ID of the tree, there's one version of the whole story about the world according to which the tree is such a collection. It's M-possible that the tree is a collection of ideas. Since material beings are necessarily not such collections, it follows that the tree is not a material thing.

That's flagrantly question-begging. And in any event many of us will question the claim that there is such an ID of the tree. I for one doubt that the dualist's argument does much better than the idealist's. Materialists will naturally challenge proposed dualist-friendly IDs of people. A different but not unrelated problem arises when we ask just what full descriptions of 'the world' are supposed to be descriptions of. There's a sense in which 'the actual world' is abstract, being one of many world-propositions (call that proposition A@). But it's hard to see how Swinburne's full descriptions of the world can be descriptions of any proposition. Why should IDs for commonplace things be required for a description of proposition A@? More promising is the idea that Swinburnean descriptions are descriptions of what sometimes is called 'the concrete actual world' (C@ say).[2] A@ itself appears to be a full description of C@, given the assumption that A@ is a maximally correct representation of C@. And why should we believe that A@ says that we are purely mental substances?

Rea argues for a compatibilist position with respect to Jonathan Edwards's theory of original sin (guilt) and the conviction that we are morally responsible only for things we can (at some time) prevent. That's bad news for Edwards, who defends an incompatibilist position (p. 345). Two versions of Edwards's thesis are considered, the Organic Whole Theory and the Fission Theory. The former says (very roughly) that there is a composite temporally extended being, Humanity, whose human constituents all bear responsibility for the misdeeds of Adam. Rea argues that the Fission Theory is more promising. On the 'stage' version of that theory we (presently existing humans) have past and future counterparts whose actions once were or will be our actions. If God proclaims that Adam is a temporal counterpart of (say) Rea's, then the misdeeds of Adam are misdeeds of Rea's. Assuming that Adam once had the power not to perform such actions, Rea once had that power. This amounts to a divine command theory of persistence. We might be skeptical of the claim that it is 'up to God' to decide when things persist. My instinct is that counterpart theory encourages such skepticism, since it is widely agreed that there can be different (but equally good) accounts of what does and doesn't qualify as a worldly counterpart of Rea. (It's not 'up to God' what is and isn't a worldly counterpart of Rea; it's a case of 'you pay your money and you take your choice'.) If that's the way things work for modal counterparts, then presumably it's also true of temporal counterparts.

Leftow's paper addresses subtle questions concerning identity. Consider Socrates-awake (AS) and Socrates-sleeping (SS). SS and AS do not stand in a relation of psychological continuity, so arguably SS ≠ AS. Intuitively the sleeping body (SB) and the body that is awake (AB) are identical. We might conclude that we are not identical with our bodies. We (people who are awake) perish when we fall asleep. Since our bodies don't then perish, we aren't our bodies. Leftow questions such reasoning. The first two premises of the following argument are never true at the same time (p. 371):

(1) AS = AB.

(2) SS = SB.

(3) SB = AB.

(4) SS = AS.

The second premise is true only when (as we normally would say) Socrates is asleep, the first only when Socrates is awake. The terms 'SS' and 'AS' are, temporally speaking, non-rigid designators. ('SS' has a referent only when Socrates is asleep; 'SA' has a referent only when Socrates is awake.) We can thus reject (4) and accept (3) without commitment to an unqualified rejection of (1) and (2). Leftow conjectures that something like this (some close relative of temporary identity) may serve to disarm charges that the Trinity is incoherent. The 'triune Persons' are to God as the awake and the sleeping Socrates are to Socrates’ body (pp. 373-374). Reservations about this arise from the conviction that (as Leftow agrees) transitivity holds when (temporary) identities are true at the same time. If there's a time at which the Father and the Son are 'both identical with God, then the Father is the Son”. There aren't (as advertized) three divine Persons in the works even when we allow temporary identity.

[1] Peter Unger says that Berkeley's Idealism is "a coherent view of reality". See "Free Will and Scientiphicalism", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXV (July 2002), p. 8.

[2] See Ned Markosian's "A Defense of Presentism", in Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. I (2004), ed. by Dean Zimmerman.