Perspectival Realism

Perspectival Realism

Michela Massimi, Perspectival Realism, Oxford University Press, 2022, 432pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197555620.

Reviewed by Maria Panagiotatou and Stathis Psillos, National and Kapodistrian University of Athens

Reviewed by Maria Panagiotatou and Stathis Psillos, National and Kapodistrian University of Athens


Michela Massimi’s much anticipated book, Perspectival Realism, (henceforth, PR) reveals already from the first chapter the enormous range of research, both scientific and philosophical, which preceded its publication. As it is the result of an impressive ERC-funded project that was directed at combining the history and philosophy of science with scientific practice and achievements from different disciplines, we expected nothing less.

The key aim of PR is to offer an epistemology for scientific realism, which brings together the point-of-viewish nature of representation in science and the realist optimism that, at the end of the day, science succeeds in opening up windows to a perspective-independent reality. Like many attempts to bring together two prima facie competing views, PR’s project, though invariably interesting and novel, fails to deliver the requested compromise. To put the point in the form of a slogan, insofar as it’s realist, PR isn’t perspectival and insofar as it’s perspectival, PR isn’t (necessarily) realist.

There are four key elements of PR. First, PR is said to be offering an epistemology of scientific knowledge, and not a metaphysics of science. As Massimi explains, she prefers to think of realism in science as an answer mostly to an epistemological question and not as addressing the issue of what exists; her PR ‘is not a metaphysics-first view. It is a project in the epistemology of science’ (9). Her focus is ‘on the reliability of the scientific knowledge claims’ and her approach differs from others concerning ‘the role played by scientific perspectives in assessing reliability’ (5). Second, a scientific perspective is characterised as ‘the actual—historically and culturally situated—scientific practice of a real scientific community at a given historical time’ (5). Interestingly, what is perspectival isn’t truth but justification: on her view, ‘The truth of knowledge claims endorsed by particular epistemic communities is ultimately a matter of correspondence with the way the world is and depends on having reliable experimental, technological, and theoretical procedures for arriving at these claims. How those reliably formed claims are in turn justified is, however, perspectival’ (7–8).

The third key element concerns the realism of PR. We are told that Massimi’s realism is about phenomena. Not any kind of phenomena, but what she calls modally robust phenomena, that is ‘phenomena that do not just occur, but could occur under a range of different experimental, theoretical, and modelling circumstances and across a variety of perspectival data-to-phenomena inferences’ (15).

The fourth element concerns the nature of representation in science, which is heavily indebted to a distinction between two varieties of perspectival representations in painting. Following Catherine Z. Elgin’s account of the perspectival element of representation as being ‘from a particular point of view’; and, most importantly, being such that ‘the particular point of view is deemed to affect the content of the representation’ (39), and after a detailed examination of two famous paintings (Diego Velázquez’s Las Meninas and Jan van Eyck’s Portrait of Giovanni (?) Arnolfini and his Wife), Massimi distinguishes between perspectival1 and perspectival2 representations in science. The first kind amounts to saying ‘that many models for the same target system represent selected features of the target system as y, or as j, or as k, where y, j, and k are different properties belonging to a “horizon of alternatives” and often enough incompatible or inconsistent with one another’ (40). According to the second kind ‘The representational content is not itself perspectival in that it is not affected by the vantage point from which the representation takes place: it is not an instance of representing-as understood as ascribing alternative and incompatible attributes or properties’ (41). This distinction is of critical importance for the whole argument of PR, since the difference between the two kinds of perspectival representation is that only perspectival2 creates ‘the effect of a “window on reality” extending beyond the boundaries of the representation itself’ (41).

PR, then, is (meant to be) both perspectival and realist. In particular, PR subscribes to two natural assumptions (44): the representationalist assumption (‘the claims of knowledge delivered by a scientific model, are true (or approximately true) when the model provides a partial yet accurate representation of the target system’) and the perspectivalist assumption (‘Scientific models offer perspectival representations of relevant aspects of a given target system S [. . . .] Namely, scientific model M1 perspectivally1 represents S as z; but model M2 perspectivally1 represents S as y (where z and y are properties belonging to a ‘horizon of alternatives’)). And yet, there is an important tension between those two assumptions. For the perspectivalist assumption is fully consistent with the assignment of incompatible properties to the very same target system from a plurality of perspectival1 representations. Admitting this would put realism in jeopardy: realism isn’t compatible with the existence of mutually inconsistent representations of the same target system. Insofar as PR has a realist component, we are confronted with s a bomb that needs to be defused.

Massimi calls this bomb the ‘problem of inconsistent models’ (PIM), viz., the problem ‘that different models may deliver different, sometimes incompatible, or even inconsistent images for the same phenomenon’ (53). The bomb wouldn’t be defused, even if someone argued that ‘there is one and only one model among [a plurality of models] that genuinely provides a veridical (no matter how partial and perspectival1) de re representation of the target system’ (56), the reason being that it would leave ‘the purpose of a plurality of models’ unexplained and redundant if it were admitted that only one model could offer a veridical de re representation.

To properly defuse the PIM bomb, Massimi reformulates PIM, thereby revealing two hidden premises tacitly attached to the representationalist assumption (68–69). The first is representing-as-mapping according to which

Offering an accurate, partial, de re representation means to establish a one-to-one mapping between relevant (partial) features of the model and relevant (partial)—actual or fictional—states of affairs about the target system. (66–67)

The second hidden premise is truth-by-truthmakers, according to which

States of affairs ascribe essential properties to particulars, and, as such, they act as ontological grounds that make the knowledge claims afforded by the model (approximately) true (67).

She names the reformulation of the argument Have-Your-Cake-And-Eat-It (HYCAEI) and claims that it’s only through those two hidden premises that PIM is a real threat for perspectivism and realism. In an important paragraph at the end of chapter 3, Massimi writes:

The real bite of PIM lies in the assumption that different perspectival models ascribe different essential properties to the same target system. But the charge of metaphysical inconsistency (and also that of instability) is ultimately based on an unduly stringent realist reading of the representationalist assumption, captured by the two hidden premises (noted above). I have here only made the point that one does not have to accept either of them. Representing-as-mapping and truth-by-truthmakers are not forced upon us. And since HYCAEI relies on them, resisting them is a way of resisting PIM. (72)

Here is the issue: let us grant that the two hidden premises are the culprits for the PIM bomb, and that the defusion is effective. Still, is PR realist enough?

To answer this question, let us take a closer look at Massimi’s alternative to the representing-as-mapping assumption. Part of her model pluralism is the claim that the perspectival models ‘are best characterized as exploratory, enabling a particular kind of inferential reasoning that explores what is possible’ (76). Massimi adopts an inferentialist account of models in science: models are used by epistemic communities as sources of inferences which relay information about the target system. As such, they are seen as ‘inferential blueprints’, which ‘deliver modal knowledge claims by inviting us to physically conceive particular scenarios’ (74). Hence the target of the representational game in science isn’t to achieve mappings-onto-what-is-actual, but is instead to explore the possible. Therefore, Massimi isn’t particularly bothered by PIM, since it’s only when we try to understand a phenomenon the way it actually is that we face the challenge of inconsistent models. How can we get realism out of the inferential blueprints? Here the answer is that in looking for what is possible, the various epistemic communities ‘come to reliably identify modally robust phenomena’ (74); that is, phenomena which a) display lawlike connections and b) are inferred via modelling across a number of different perspectives. So, while every perspectival representation is a perspectival1 representation, being from a specific vantage point, it happens that, occasionally, a perspectival2 representation emerges that is independent from the vantage point of the perspectival1 representation. The three case-studies, concerning models of the atomic nucleus, climate modelling, and models of dyslexia in language development, which are detailed in the long chapter 4, aim to highlight the ‘exploratory exercise in each case and how it does provide us with a “window on reality”’ (83).

We have already seen that for Massimi, PR is an epistemic position. It’s no surprise then, that when she discusses the role of laws of nature in capturing the aim of physical conceivability, she stresses that laws of nature provide no ‘metaphysical tether’ (165). For her, the notion of possibility involved in perspectival modelling is thoroughly epistemic (‘What is possible is always and only what is possible for historically and culturally situated epistemic communities’ and yet ‘objective’ (161)). How is that possible? Massimi distinguishes ‘lawhood’ of the ‘known laws of nature’ with ‘lawlikeness’ of stable events in nature. About ‘lawhood’, she advocates a perspectival version of David Lewis’s Best System Account where the principles of ‘simplicity, strength, and balance (SSB) are always contextual standards, defined by any given scientific perspective sp at a given historical time’ (164). She emphasises that

Being a law is contingent upon our Best System and its perspectival standards of simplicity, strength, and balance. Yet the specific (causal or non-causal) lawlike dependencies among relevant features of specific phenomena that act as target systems for perspectival modelling are not contingent. (166)

Therefore, ‘lawlikeness’ (or ‘lawlike dependencies’) is ‘grounded in nature and is not on wheels’. It is perspective-independent, and ‘is something that a perspectival realist shares with the empiricist and the realist’ independently ‘of which particular metaphysical view one endorses about the “laws of nature”’ (167).

Massimi stresses that the ‘indicative conditionals’ that scientists can use to express inferences about phenomena of interest, ‘do not bear any hefty metaphysical import up their sleeves’ (176). That job is for lawlike dependencies. She goes on to describe lawlike dependencies in a way that reminds us of the metaphysical thesis of scientific realism; a mind-independent world (or, to be more precise, the lawlike dependencies we meet/find in the world) is described as perspective-independent:

Lawlike dependencies are perspective-independent. They do not change with the scientific model or the scientific perspective. They are not affected by changing scientific language or concepts. And they do not have to be enshrined in the Laws of Nature in a Best System (although often they are in the physical sciences; less so in other areas). That there are such lawlike dependencies is a fact about nature, not about us, or our scientific perspectives. (176)

The realism of PR is a bottom-up kind of realism ‘from data to phenomena, and from phenomena to natural kinds’ (183). In her search for the appropriate ontology for PR, Massimi’s intention is to combine the main insights of three grand philosophical traditions: considering that knowledge cannot be only empirical occurrences (as empiricism advocates), she adopts the realist position that ‘Science is also about theorizing; coming up with hypotheses about unobservable entities that might be responsible for the observable phenomena’ (184), while acknowledging that ‘human beings have no privileged epistemic access to a world of essences, dispositions, potencies, unobservable entities, and so forth’ and emphasising (as constructivism does) that ‘Our scientific knowledge is knowledge of particular epistemic communities at particular times and places’ (185). So, ‘The ontology that best fits perspectival realism has to take into account that scientific knowledge has empirical roots, a modal nature, and is historically and culturally situated’ (186). In this context, she formulates her ‘perspectival view of how data reliably provide evidence of phenomena’ (193–195).

According to Massimi,

Phenomena are stable events indexed to a particular domain of inquiry, and modally robust across a variety of perspectival data-to-phenomena inferences. (207)

Unpacking the definition, Massimi notes that ‘phenomena are events’ and ‘not things, entities, structures, facts, or states of affairs’ (207). But not all events are candidates for phenomena; ‘Being indexed to a particular domain is key to identifying events that are candidates for phenomena and sieving them aside from those that are not’ (209). But again, ‘being indexed to a particular domain’ isn’t enough. Another criterion to identify phenomena from events is ‘stability’ and ‘It is lawlikeness that makes these events stable’ (209). Massimi sees lawlikeness as ‘a primitive relation of stable events in nature’ that grounds ‘a first-tier modality at play’ (210).

The ‘modal robustness’ (second-tier modality) is said to be taken ‘not as an intrinsic property of phenomena but as a secondary quality’ which arises from the interplay among three elements, viz., one perspective-independent (the stability of the relevant event) and two perspective-dependent ones (the data that provide evidence for the stability and the situated epistemic communities able to tease out the network of perspectival inferences from the data to the stable event) (211). In other words, Massimi relocates ‘modality from categorical properties, dispositions, capacities, or potencies’ (or other ‘hidden goings on’) ‘to a secondary quality of phenomena’ (modal robustness) ‘that includes references to epistemic communities’ (217). The main example that she uses to explain modal robustness is the ‘decay of the Higgs boson’ (214).

What is noteworthy is that the burden of realism in PR is borne by whatever is perspective independent. In the last section of chapter 6 Massimi fulfills her ‘promise of explaining what a perspectival realist is a realist about’. She writes that

stable events would be exactly the same with or without the particular scientific perspectives that human beings have historically developed. This is realism. At the same time, what makes a stable event a ‘phenomenon’ does depend on us as epistemic agents. Teasing out the space of inferences does depend on the scientific perspective in use and associated perspectival models as inferential blueprints (wherever applicable), and technological and experimental resources. Indeed, it is a prerogative of historically and culturally situated epistemic communities. (217)

Given the centrality of lawlikeness for the realist credentials of PR, it’s no accident that Massimi calls lawlikeness ‘the realist tether in perspectival realism’ (263). Insofar as lawlike dependencies are realist, they are perspective-independent and vice versa. Stable events constitute phenomena insofar as they ‘display lawlike dependencies’ (267). For instance, ‘the stable event associated with the phenomenon “cathode rays bending” is the expression of the lawlike dependency between the electrical nature of cathode rays and the way they respond to a magnetic field’ (267). It follows that phenomena are perspective-independent!

Yet, PR’s realism is mitigated by considerations that have to do with broadly subjective elements. This becomes obvious when Massimi introduces her conception of Natural Kinds with A Human Face (NKHF):

Natural kinds are (i) historically identified and open-ended groupings of modally robust phenomena, (ii) each displaying lawlike dependencies among relevant features, (iii) that enable truth-conducive conditionals-supporting inferences over time. (226)

Far from being ‘given’, that is, from being ‘part of nature’s furniture’, NKHF are ‘the outcome of humankind’s scientific and cultural history’ (250). NKHF are ‘the end products of concerted efforts of generations, who have successfully identified relevant groupings of phenomena in nature’ (250). But then Massimi asks the important question: ‘what counts as a relevant grouping?’ (250). Or, in other words, what groups certain phenomena together into a NKHF?

While a typical realist answer would be couched in terms of some objective worldly feature (from the strong view of essential properties, qua universals, to the weaker one of objective similarities and differences among particulars), Massimi’s answer introduces various perspective-dependent elements. She talks about ‘the central role played by epistemic communities occupying a plurality of situated perspectives in the identification of groupings of phenomena candidates for natural kinds’ (253). She says, quite explicitly, ‘It is not about locating a natural kind within a causal network of events, a phylogenetic lineage, or something similar. Rather, it is about the natural kind being a historically identified grouping of phenomena that different historically and culturally situated epistemic communities have encountered over time’ (257). The problem with such an answer is that the distinction between what we think there is in the world and what there is in the world becomes blurred. Massimi herself couldn’t have put this objection in a better way: ‘Surely, either something is a natural kind or it is not. The way in which our beliefs, representations, or conceptions change should not affect basic metaphysical facts’ (266).

Although Massimi does try to address this challenge (see section 8.5), we think the answer isn’t quite adequate. There is some rather vague reference to ‘the nomological resilience of in-the-making kinds’—where nomological resilience has to do with the fact that ‘natural kinds are taken as supporting laws of nature’ (230)—being ‘a good indicator that the groupings of historically identified phenomena have (causal or non-causal) lawlike dependencies among relevant features’ (268). The question here is this: how do we move from perspective-dependent practices to perspective-independent reality? Massimi is fully aware of the force of this objection. This is how she puts it herself: ‘Can an account of natural kinds that centres on epistemic communities and perspectival vantage points qualify for the label ‘realism’?’ (253).

For Massimi: ‘An epistemology of science that gives perspectival pluralism its due forces us to rethink the realist ontology that should accompany it’ (279). Yet, the key to this rethinking is the primitive notion of lawlikeness which replaces the ontology of properties-plus-laws. Is there an argument in favour of PR being the only defensible realist view? To her credit, Massimi doesn’t claim that there is one. Rather, she sees ‘perspectival realism as making room for different ways of thinking about realism in science rather than winning arguments about who is right and who is wrong on metaphysical matters’ (278–9). She goes on to say: ‘A leitmotiv of this book is that one might consider replacing an ontology of properties with one of phenomena. I have not given any knock-down argument for this claim, but offered instead a series of localized moves to this effect’ (279).

Given Massimi’s insistence that whatever plays the role of the realist tether of PR—notably, the all-important-to-her-views lawlike dependencies—is perspective-independent, we think it’s fair to say that PR is realist insofar as it’s non-perspectival. Conversely, given that the perspectival element of PR introduces features that are consistent with a non-realist account of science (be it subjective or constructivist), we think that insofar as PR is perspectival, it isn’t necessarily realist.

None of the above, however, affects our admiration for Massimi’s achievement in Perspectival Realism. She has succeeded in setting the agenda for future philosophical thinking about science, both at the level of the content (rich as her book is in its engagement with a host of philosophical issues) and at the level of style (with its wealth of information about science in its history and its current polymorphous practice).


We would like to thank the usual suspects, friends and colleagues, for their thoughtful comments during the year-long reading group in which we studied Perspectival Realism.