Perspectival Thought: A Plea for (Moderate) Relativism

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François Recanati, Perspectival Thought: A Plea for (Moderate) Relativism, Oxford University Press, 2007, 308pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199230549.

Reviewed by Kepa Korta, University of the Basque Country


In Perspectival Thought, François Recanati, one of the most prolific and influential authors in contemporary philosophy of language, articulates his view about the contents of utterances and thoughts. Departing from the limits of the debate between literalism and contextualism about the context-dependence of utterance content, addressed in his celebrated Literal Meaning (2004), Recanati turns to the philosophy of mind for strong arguments in favor of the view he dubs 'Strong Moderate Relativism.' This view admits, besides context-invariant content, two distinct kinds of contents for our utterances and thoughts: the lekton, or explicitly articulated content, possibly incomplete; and the 'Austinian' proposition representing the complete truth-conditional content. Perspectival Thought can be considered as a sophisticated elaboration of the old Stoic notion of lekton in the light of modern arguments in the philosophy of language and mind.

To a large extent, a traditional assumption that can be called 'monopropositionalism' has permeated philosophy of language, semantics and pragmatics; namely, the assumption that for each utterance there is one, and only one, truth-conditional content (indiscriminately called 'the proposition expressed,' 'the semantic content,' 'the explicature' or 'the truth-conditions' of the utterance, or 'what is said' by the speaker when uttering a sentence). Given this assumption, the debate between literalism and contextualism turns out to be a debate about the degree of context-dependence of that content and its best characterization. Thus, if in a conversation about, say, weather in Donostia, I utter today, May 13, at noon

(1) It is raining

the discussion is, first, whether, besides the time of utterance which arguably is articulated by the tense, the place of the raining event -- Donostia -- is an element of the proposition expressed or not; and, second, if it is, how it gets to be a constituent of that proposition. On the first issue, minimalists are glad to admit that it is not, that the content of (1) is just the proposition that it's raining on May 13, at noon, period. On the second issue, among those who would admit the place as an element of the truth-conditions, so-called indexicalists would count it as a contextual supplementation triggered by the conventional meaning of the weather-predicate, while contextualists would, in general, take it as an 'unarticulated constituent' product of pragmatically-driven, not linguistically triggered, processes of enrichment.

Whatever the arguments on cases like (1) and many others, discussed in detail by Recanati himself in several places (2002, 2004, 2007a, 2007b), in Perspectival Thought, Recanati frames the debate on utterance- and thought-content along different lines. He abandons monopropositionalism. Admitting the existence of different levels of content -- context-invariant content, explicit or articulated content and full propositional content -- allows him to do so.

In another nod to Western classics, Recanati divides Perspectival Thought into three 'books.' Books are divided into four or five parts, and parts are divided into three or four chapters; so we end up with a total of forty-one chapters. But chapters are very short -- four or five pages long, adding to a total of 308 pages -- allowing for lively and pleasurable reading.

Book I, entitled 'Moderate Relativism,' presents the basics of his view. Relativism stems from the application of two general principles concerning the distinction between content and circumstance of evaluation. The first principle (Duality) claims that "to get a truth-value, we need a circumstance of evaluation as well as a content to evaluate" (p. 33). The second principle (Distribution) states that

the determinants of truth-value distribute over the two basic components truth-evaluation involves: content and circumstance. That is, a determinant of truth-value, e.g. a time, is either given as an ingredient of content or as an aspect of the circumstance of evaluation. (p. 34)

Even non-relativists who take contents to be complete and eternal could be construed as accepting duality. Frege himself distinguishes content from context of evaluation -- the world -- as he considers that fictional and non-serious sentences do have content but they are not evaluable as true or false, since they are not intended to talk about the world. But non-relativists would not accept distribution. According to their view, all determinants of truth-value are part of the content; particularly, the time. So, for instance, the content of an utterance of 'Dion is alive' includes the time of utterance as an element of its content; a content that would be either true or false when evaluated in the actual world, period.

Relativists, in contrast, accept distribution, and take the content of an utterance 'Dion is alive' to be a time-relative or temporal proposition, true at some times, false at others. Following Recanati, among relativists a further distinction can be made. Radical relativists would insist that these propositions, though relative, are complete; moderate relativists that these contents can be propositionally incomplete, and that the full truth-conditions involve the circumstance of evaluation. In Perspectival Thought, Recanati is not concerned with radical versions of relativism. His aim is to defend moderate relativism: a position that admits possibly incomplete relativized propositions and full complete eternal propositions, as well. According to this view, utterance (1) would express both the place-relative lekton 'It is raining on May 13, at noon,' and the full proposition that 'It is raining in Donostia on May 13, at noon.' Now, if I had uttered

(2) It is raining here

thus making explicit the place of utterance, the full truth-conditions would be the same as those of (1), but the lekton would be different, with Donostia as a constituent in the case of (2), but not in the case of (1). Now, in cases like (2), where all the relevant determinants of truth-conditions are explicit in the lekton, one could think that the distinction between lekton and full propositional content would no longer hold. This is what defenders of 'Weak Moderate Relativism' assume. But Recanati holds, instead, 'Strong Moderate Relativism (SMR)' that keeps the distinction even when the lekton happens to be a classical full proposition, for he takes the full truth-conditional content to be an Austinian proposition that includes the situation concerned (Barwise and Etchemendy, 1987).

After introducing the basics of SMR, in Book I, Recanati discusses the arguments for and against temporal or time-relative propositions, which have their original foundations in the work of Stoic logic. Prior's work on the logic of tense and time is one of its best modern representatives. As a matter of fact, Prior's proposal using temporal operators applied to temporal propositions is not, seemingly, the dominant view. This is due to arguments from linguists such as Partee and Kamp, together with philosophical arguments about the contents of beliefs and belief reports. Recanati assesses these arguments carefully, and acknowledges that Kaplan's well-known arguments for temporal propositions are not wholly convincing. That's why his main aim in Perspectival Thought is to offer better arguments for relativized propositions as contents (though not the only contents) for our utterances and thoughts.

In Book II, 'Experience and Subjectivity,' Recanati moves to arguments in the philosophy of mind. He considers the Searlean distinction between mode and content and its application to the analysis of visual perception and episodic memory. Recanati argues that the lekton in those cases is a temporal proposition and that it is the mode, not the content, which determines the situation of evaluation, which is part of the Austinian proposition. Take, for instance, a person's visual perception of a flower. According to Recanati (p. 135), using capital letters for the mode and a clause in parentheses for the content, this visual experience is best represented as

VIS EXP (that there is a flower there)

and not as Searle does, namely,

VIS EXP (that there is a flower there and that there is a flower there is causing this visual experience).

In Recanati's view, Searle's proposal is adequate as a description of the full truth-conditions of the visual experience that reflects their causal self-referentiality. For the content to be true, there must be a flower there causing the subject's visual experience. However, Searle's proposal is wrong as a representation of what is seen by the subject, because the subject does not see the causal relation as part of the scene seen. The distinction between the lekton and the full Austinian proposition can easily accommodate this. The mode (VIS EXP) determined that the lekton is to be evaluated with respect to the perceptual situation, and that situation is not part of the lekton but of the complete Austinian proposition.

SMR also gives an elegant explanation of the similarities and the differences between perception and memory. The subject's memory that there was a flower there shares with the visual experience the temporal lekton that there is a flower there, but differs in the time of the circumstance of evaluation: the visual experience requires simultaneity, while the memory mode requires the time to be the past.

Recanati then (Part 6) moves to what will turn out to be one of the main themes of Perspectival Thought: the self. Arguably, the self is involved in the truth-conditions of our perceptual and memory states, that is, they are de se thoughts. Now, following the principle of distribution, the self may be explicitly represented in the content and, therefore, be part of the lekton, but it need not, being only part of the full truth-conditions. This amounts to the distinction between implicit and explicit de se thoughts, both of which are different from de re thoughts about an individual x who happens to be oneself. In few words, implicit de se thoughts are immune to error through misidentification; explicit de se thoughts and de re thoughts are not.

In the last chapters of Book II, Recanati discusses the SMR analysis of these different thought-contents and our reports, discussing interesting issues on emotions and imagination and other cases of de se thoughts, and contrasting it with the reflexivism of Higginbotham (2003) that takes the contents of these thoughts to be explicit reflexive propositions instead of relative propositions.

Book III, entitled 'Egocentricity and Beyond,' starts with a discussion of Perry's (1979, 1986) celebrated concept of 'unarticulated constituents' and the place they have within utterance- and thought-content. Perry is concerned with utterances like

(1) It is raining

in contrast to

(2) It is raining here

in which a truth-conditionally relevant element like the place of the raining event is not articulated in the utterance or mental representation. Similarly Perry is concerned with the case of 'essentially indexical' de se utterances and thoughts. Should these unarticulated constituents be considered part of the lekton or, alternatively, as elements of the situation concerned? Recanati considers some arguments for and against relativized propositions as lekta (by Castañeda, Perry, Millikan, Lewis, among others), about the external non-cognitive determination of those elements and their invariance and shiftability across contexts and situations. He argues against the idea that the lekton contains any unarticulated element of this sort. The lekton, he claims, only contains elements that are explicitly articulated; so unarticulated constituents, if any, are part only of the complete Austinian proposition. In this sense, the lekton is context-sensitive as far as it contains indexical constituents. Unarticulated constituents are provided by the circumstance of evaluation (the situation), which composes, with the lekton, the complete Austinian proposition.

To sum up, Recanati's Strong Moderate Relativism is a three-level theory of the contents of our utterances and thoughts, corresponding to

i. the context-independent meaning of the sentence (type) uttered, on the linguistic side; the narrow psychological content of the mental representation, on the mental side; or the 'character,' using Kaplan's terminology;

ii. the explicit context-dependent lekton or Kaplan's 'content'; and

iii. the Austinian proposition that includes both the situation and the lekton.

This three-level approach frees Recanati from the corset of monopropositionalism that had confined most approaches until now. Those approaches assumed that there was only one content to choose from the various candidates (either eternal, incomplete, relativized, reflexive, classical, Austinian or your favored kind of proposition) for any utterance or thought, and that that single content played such different roles as representing the truth-conditions of the utterance/thought, the psychologically relevant content, the content that accounts for same-saying (or same-thinking), the output of semantics, the input for the inference of conversational implicatures, and so on. Assuming a 'pluripropositional' stance, Recanati distinguishes the roles to be played by each content, in an approach that could be compared with Perry's reflexive-referential theory. Perry (2001a, 2001b) distinguishes more than three contents, and he characterizes many of those contents as reflexive -- contents about the utterance or thought itself -- rather than relativized propositions. I myself would very much have appreciated seeing Recanati's assessment of the similarities and differences between these two pluripropositionalist views: Are three levels of content enough? Are the intermediate levels best characterized as reflexive or as relativized propositions? It seems to me that some important arguments against 'reflexivism' lose much of their force when the reflexive content is not postulated as the content of the utterance or thought but as one kind of content among others. But we must wait for some future occasion, since when discussing reflexivism, Recanati chooses "not [to] discuss the subtleties of Perry's reflexivism here nor compare it in detail with Higginbotham's" (p. 165, n. 72).

In any case, as always, Recanati has presented a work full of insights, important theoretical distinctions, and careful and detailed arguments, with a myriad of inspiring examples. Once again, he has managed to reflect in an organized way much of the ongoing debate on utterance- and thought-content, and to trace back the issues to their historical and conceptual roots. At the same time, it can be expected that Recanati, once again, will decisively contribute to framing the future debate and to setting the agenda for the discussion. That's why Perspectival Thought is a must for anyone with interest in current and future debates in the philosophy of language and the philosophy of mind.


Barwise, Jon and Etchemendy, John, (1987), The Liar: An Essay on Truth and Circularity. New York: Oxford University Press.

Higginbothan, James (2003), "Tensed Second Thoughts." In A. Jokic and Q. Smith (eds.), Time, Tense and Reference. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, pp. 191-7.

Perry, John (1979), "The Problem of the Essential Indexical." Noûs 13: 3-21. Reprinted (with a postscript) in Perry (2000).

Perry, John (1986), "Thought without Representation." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 60: 137-51. Reprinted (with a postscript) in Perry (2000).

Perry, John (2000), The Problem of the Essential Indexical and Other Essays (Expanded Edition). Stanford: CSLI Publications.

Perry, John (2001a), Reference and Reflexivity. Stanford: CSLI Publications.

Perry, John (2001b), Knowledge, Possibility and Consciousness. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.

Recanati, François (2002), "Unarticulated Constituents." Linguistics and Philosophy 25: 299-345.

Recanati, François (2004), Literal Meaning. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Recanati, François (2007a), "It is raining (somewhere)." Linguistics and Philosophy 30: 123-146.

Recanati, François (2007b), "Relativized propositions." In Michael O'Rourke & Corey Washington (eds.), Situating Semantics: Essays on the Philosophy of John Perry, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, pp. 119-153.