Perspectives on Perception

Placeholder book cover

Mary Margaret McCabe and Mark Textor (eds.), Perspectives on Perception, Ontos, 2007, 177pp., €79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793732.

Reviewed by José Luis Bermúdez, Washington University in St. Louis


This collection of essays is a Festschrift for the London philosopher Alan Lacey. It grew out of a conference organized at King's College, London in 2006 to celebrate Lacey's 80th birthday. The contributors are all friends and former colleagues of Lacey, almost all of them closely associated with King's College, where Lacey is an emeritus faculty member.

As the title suggests, perception is the focus of all eight essays in this short book. It is unusual (but to my mind most welcome) that the book contains essays in the history of philosophy as well as essays on problems in contemporary analytical philosophy of perception. Lacey's own interests and research lie mainly in early Greek philosophy. This is reflected in a substantial essay by Mary McCabe on a puzzling and much discussed passage from Aristotle's De Anima, together with a more synoptic paper by Richard Sorabji surveying some of the principal themes of his recently published Self: Ancient and Modern Insights about Individuality, Life, and Death. The historical section of the book is rounded out by Anthony Savile's close reading of the short but important section of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason standardly translated as 'The clue to the discovery of all the pure concepts of the understanding'. These historical essays all build bridges to the types of problem and issue that concern the non-historical contributors to the volume (and others working in these areas).

Some recent commentators have tried to read back into Aristotle's De Anima 3.2 discussion of how we perceive that we see and hear some aspects of our contemporary concern with problems of consciousness and higher-order thought. On this view, what Aristotle is trying to explain is the subjectivity of perception. He is proposing an account of phenomenal consciousness. McCabe's well-crafted essay is a corrective to this view (and will come as a relief to those who have always suspected that Aristotle was far too sensible to ruminate about qualia). She argues carefully and persuasively that the real foil of De Anima 3.2 is Plato, rather than the what-it-is-likeness of perception. Whereas in the Theaetetus perception is portrayed as a simple phenomenon that, as it were, provides raw materials for the soul to scrutinize, Aristotle's De Anima account tries to build a degree of reflective capacity into the content of perception. On McCabe's interpretation, which she suggestively connects to Aristotle's ethical theory, Aristotle is closing the gap between perception and judgment, rather than exploring phenomenal feels.

The relation between perception and judgment is, of course, one of the principal themes of Kant's deduction of the categories. A broadly Kantian conception of this relation has received much discussion in contemporary philosophy, thanks to the well-known work of John McDowell. The thrust of Savile's essay is very much in the same direction. He manages to shed light on three important but rather obscure paragraphs by showing how they can be interpreted in terms of the basic insight that experience is essentially propositional. The unity of experience is achieved through "binding" the constituent elements of experience into propositional wholes -- a binding that is achieved through the pure concepts of the understanding. Savile's interpretation seemed compelling to this non-specialist, but I would have liked to see more discussion of how it relates to some of the principal strands of interpretation of this section of the Critique.

The papers by McCabe and Savile both take as a background assumption what Mark Textor, in his paper 'Seeing something and believing IN it', calls the propositional view of belief. This is the view that beliefs represent the world propositionally, in a way that can only be captured by 'that--' clauses of the familiar type. McCabe and Savile pose the question of how closely Aristotle and Kant assimilated the content of perception to the propositional content of belief. As Textor reminds us, however, the propositional view of belief has not always been accepted. It was certainly not accepted by the British empiricists, for example. His paper draws upon Brentano to develop a nominal view of belief and judgment, according to which the content of at least some beliefs can be completely specified by a singular or plural term. Textor argues for this by pointing out (a) that some perceptions have nominal contents and (b) that there are beliefs that simply take those perceptions at face value. If we understand a thinker's taking a perception at face value as her taking the attitude of belief to the content of the perception, then (a) and (b) certainly give the conclusion that there are nominal beliefs. The problem is that the plausibility of this way of thinking about what it is to take a perception at face value seems to stand or fall with the propositional view. If, to take Textor's own example (at p. 73), I perceive the colors of the rainbow and then take my perception at face value, what exactly is it that I come to believe? It seems bizarre to say that I believe the colors of the rainbow -- and only slightly less bizarre that I believe in the colors of the rainbow (what would it be not to believe in the colors of the rainbow?). My own suspicion is that Textor has been too quick to adopt the nominal view of perception. It is true that perception can be reported in nominalistic terms, but that is not to say that perception has nominal content.

Everything here depends, of course, on the account that we give of what it is for a perceiver to perceive an object. It may turn out, for example, that it is true both that x perceives O and that x perceptually represents O without it having to be the case that the content of x's perception is fully specifiable by some term that names O. In fact, as we see in Keith Hossack's paper 'Seeing an individual', this is true of most of the standard ways of thinking about the seeing relation. According to the causal theory, for example, seeing Socrates is a matter of having a visual experience that both represents Socrates and is appropriately caused by Socrates. But it is certainly not part of this theory that the content of the perception can be fully characterized simply by naming Socrates. Nor is it part of Hossack's preferred theory, which he terms the faculty theory. According to the faculty theory there is indeed a "common factor" between veridical perception and hallucination. Both cases involve a single type of mental act -- viz. the act of having a visual experience. In this respect the faculty theory diverges from the disjunctive theory. But the faculty theory takes fully on board the basic insight of disjunctivism, which is that genuine vision requires something over and above a visual experience. Seeing Socrates, on Hossack's view, involves both a visual experience as of Socrates and the mental uptake of a fact that has Socrates as a constituent. Here we see plainly the difference between a report of perception (e.g. 'Plato sees Socrates') and a report of the content of perception (e.g. 'Plato sees Socrates in front of him'). It is true that Plato sees Socrates, but false that the content of Plato's perception is fully characterized by naming Socrates.

Specifying the content of perception is, famously, no easy matter. In the case of vision one might naturally think that there is likely to be a close connection between specifying the content of Plato's visual perception of Socrates and specifying how Socrates looks to Plato. But there is a difficulty in spelling out how things look. This difficulty is the subject of Mark Sainsbury's paper 'A puzzle about how things look'. There are various constancy effects in visual perception -- brightness constancy, color constancy, and so on. Our visual systems compensate for local fluctuations in apparent brightness and apparent color to create an impression of consistency in the visual field. But it is often the case that both the local fluctuations and the impression of consistency are perceptually manifest -- as when a uniformly orange colored object whose parts are differently illuminated seems both to look orange all over and to have differently colored parts. Could this mean that vision presents us with conflicting, even contradictory, appearances? Surely not. But then how are we to characterize what is going on? Sainsbury's solution is to disambiguate the terminology of "looking". Something can look (S-look) to have a surface of a particular color without looking (V-looking) like a volume suffused with that color. A white wall viewed through rose-tinted spectacles can V-look pink while S-looking white. And it is possible for something to look (P-look) to be a certain color without either V-looking or S-looking to be that color -- as when (if philosophical legend is to be believed) everything might look yellow to someone who knows that he has jaundice and so is disinclined to take how things look to be either a case of V-looking or of S-looking. As Sainsbury elegantly shows, distinguishing these different senses of "looks" removes the temptation to find visual appearances inconsistent.

One aspect of how things look to the subject that is left untouched by Sainsbury's discussion of visual appearances -- and by the other papers discussed above -- is the vexed question of what it is like to have things appear to one the way that they do. This brings us to the qualitative aspect of perceptual experience, which is the subject of the papers by Jim Hopkins and David Papineau. Hopkins proposes an interesting resolution of the much-discussed tension between the inner and apparently non-physical features of mental events with their physical features. For Hopkins, mental innerness is not to be taken at face value. It is really a metaphor -- a way of thinking about the physical innerness of physical events in the nervous system. This is an application of the general principle, familiar from discussions of functionalism, that mental concepts are really ways of thinking about the inner causes of behavior. It leads Hopkins to a plausible-sounding diagnosis of dualism as "mistaking a partial conceptualization of something which is physical for a full conceptualization of something which is non-physical" (p. 39).

Nonetheless, whether or not we think that most mental concepts ultimately have physical referents, the fact remains that some (those standardly described as phenomenal concepts) seem to function as ways of picking out experiences in virtue of their phenomenal properties. It is not helpful to be told that phenomenal properties are, in the last analysis, physical properties. What we want to know is what it is to think about those properties under, as it were, the phenomenal mode of presentation. David Papineau's 'Phenomenal concepts are not demonstrative' modifies solutions to this problem that he had proposed in earlier work. His strategy is to compare phenomenal concepts with perceptual concepts. When we think about objects encountered in perception we deploy perceptual concepts. Papineau thinks of these as sensory templates that are set up on initial encounters with objects of the relevant type and then reactivated in subsequent encounters. These sensory templates can be exercised in imagination when no objects of the relevant type are present. According to Papineau, phenomenal concepts exploit exactly the same sensory templates as the corresponding perceptual concepts, but now the sensory templates are used to think about the experiences that they exemplify, rather than the objects of which they are experiences. According to Papineau this captures the equivalence between thinking phenomenally about an experience and thinking phenomenally with that experience.

As I hope to have brought out, there is much in this volume to engage philosophers of perception. The papers are thematically integrated and generally of high quality. The volume is a fitting tribute to its dedicatee.