Peter Lombard

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Rosemann, Philipp W., Peter Lombard, Oxford University Press, 2004, 288pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195155459.

Reviewed by Constant Mews, Monash University


Peter Lombard is one of those canonical figures in medieval theology many people have heard about, but few have actually read. In large part, this is the price of his Four Books of Sentences having been selected by Alexander of Hales as the standard set text in the early university for the study of theology. For over three hundred years, Lombard’s magnum opus answered the needs of generations of students, in providing a measured response to a wide range of rational questions they might raise about Christian belief. From Thomas Aquinas to Martin Luther, a brilliant series of great minds cut their teeth on Peter Lombard’s systematic survey of Christian doctrine, as each of them endeavored to present his analysis of the questions raised by Lombard. Inevitably, the renewal of Christian theology in the sixteenth century, with its increased emphasis on Scripture and the Fathers, led to the Lombard’s achievement slipping into obscurity. When the writings of Thomas Aquinas were elevated to canonical status by the Catholic Church in 1879, Peter Lombard acquired a de facto status as the great forerunner to the angelic doctor, but still suffered from being seen only as a prelude to what was to come.

Although the last hundred years have seen an explosion in our appreciation of the diversity of the intellectual achievement of the twelfth century, the decline of neo-scholasticism over the last four decades has meant that more attention has been given to philosophical developments and the renewal of biblical studies in the twelfth century than to its achievement in developing systematic theology. One important exception to this has been the remarkable achievement of Marcia L. Colish, through her two-volume synthesis on Peter Lombard, published by Brill in 1994, in which she vigorously asserts the systematic genius of Lombard against his contemporaries. Yet Colish’s Peter Lombard is such a vast book (just short of nine hundred pages), richly informed in many details, that I suspect not many students of medieval theology or history have sat down to read it cover to cover. The great merit of Philipp Rosemann’s Peter Lombard is that we have here an easily accessible introduction to the thought of a great theologian, reduced to just over two hundred pages. His intention is modest, to suggest why it was that Peter Lombard does deserve to be considered one of the most successful theologians of the twelfth century.

Rosemann opens his account with a chapter, “From Story to System”, that provides a useful, although inevitably broad-brush, introduction to the evolution of systematic theology as a whole, culminating in a brief survey of the major theologians whom Peter Lombard would have encountered in Paris when he first arrived in the city in around 1136. The most controversial of these was Peter Abelard, a great authority on Aristotle, who had also developed a philosophical theology, much more developed in reflection on faith and charity as the foundation of ethics than around sacraments. By contrast, Hugh of St. Victor steered away from Abelard’s heavy debt to philosophical speculation about the language of faith, and concentrated much more on an Augustinian understanding of sacraments as a foundation for his theological system. Gilbert of Poitiers had a different approach again, building his philosophical theology as commentary on the theological tracts of Boethius. Rosemann’s account does not go into much detail on these immediate predecessors, but gives enough to indicate how Lombard sought to transform the overall structure of Hugh of St Victor’s synthesis by introducing dialectical precision into his examination of individual questions. It is no accident that Lombard would later be accused by a conservative critic, John of Cornwall, of always being immersed in studying Peter Abelard’s Theologia. While Peter Lombard distanced himself from many of the particular views of Peter Abelard, there can be no doubting that he recognized the value of Abelard’s detailed critique of patristic writings, many of which he included in the Four Books of Sentences to provide a reasoned refutation of his interpretation of certain issues.

Rosemann’s summary of Lombard’s life and works is solid and informative, rather than an exposition of original research. Unlike Abelard, Lombard never really emerges as an individual personality. While aspersions were cast on his orthodoxy by critics like John of Cornwall and Walter of St. Victor (debates not examined in any detail by Rosemann), the dominant impression he presents is of a measured, analytic thinker who never set out to challenge religious convention, but also steered away from rhetorical hyperbole in debating contrary points of view. While Lombard rarely presents us with his reflection on purely philosophical questions, he tackles theological questions with an analytic clarity that would greatly help subsequent commentators.

Rosemann does not go into much detail on Lombard’s early writings, the magna glosatura on the Psalms and the Collectanea on the Epistles of St Paul, commentaries that would rival those of Gilbert of Poitiers on the same Biblical texts. His analysis is always lucid, however, and to the point. Commenting on an oral report about the hesitation of Lombard on the question of whether perfect charity could turn imperfect, Rosemann comments (p. 41): “In other words, Peter’s classroom was not a place of dogmatic instruction, but a site for the open quest for the truth, a quest in which the master himself sometimes acknowledged his lack of certainty.” It is one of those paradoxes that such assertions of theological uncertainty when made by Abelard would be construed as illustrating a dangerous subjectivism in his teaching. There may be a greater influence here of Abelard’s teaching on Lombard than has hitherto been recognized. Unlike Abelard, however, Lombard was very conscious of the need to make his reflection accessible to the widest number of students. Rosemann nicely concludes his commentary on Lombard’s scriptural glosses by reflecting on the way they were presented alongside the scriptural text. Perhaps the claim that this set the stage for “the birth of systematic theology” (p. 53) is a little overdrawn. Nonetheless, they helped provide a foundation for his contribution to the discipline.

The bulk of Rosemann’s monograph is devoted to a close analysis of the Four Books of Sentences, a work that Lombard initially completed by 1154, but then revised, releasing a second edition in 1158, only two years before his death in 1160. Whereas Colish goes into great detail in presenting an apologia for Lombard’s analysis of a wide range of issues and for his criticism of rival opinions, Rosemann confines himself more to presenting the major outline of Lombard’s argument. He makes clear that the major semantic theory underpinning Lombard’s theology is in continuity with the teaching of Augustine,that all teaching is about things or signs of things. On this point, Lombard declared his fidelity to the teaching of Hugh of St Victor against that of Peter Abelard, for whom words never signified in themselves individual things, except as a result of human imposition. Rosemann also emphasizes the centrality of Lombard’s (Augustinian) distinction between that which is used, and that which is enjoyed, above all God himself. Yet unlike Hugh, Lombard imitates Abelard in laying out contrary views, to show how they can find a rational resolution. In its systematic character, the Four Books of Sentences is like an early Gothic cathedral, rationally structured, but always intent on providing underlying clarity of focus.

After an excellent chapter expounding the overall structure of the Sentences, Rosemann devotes his remaining chapters to each of its four Books. Rosemann provides a briefer summary than Colish of the issues at stake, without necessarily presenting the full detail of their historical context. His point that Lombard was suspicious of a trend to what he considered excessive philosophical speculation in theology is an important one. Also significant is his emphasis on the centrality of love in Lombard’s theology, whether spoken about in terms of the Holy Spirit, the mutual love of Father and Son, or as the foundation of all virtues. Criticizing Colish’s interpretation that Lombard teaches that the Holy Spirit assists man with developing the virtue of charity, Rosemann presents sound evidence (p. 87) for supporting von Harnack’s observation about the originality of Lombard’s teaching “that the human love of God and neighbor is nothing other than the unmediated presence of the Holy Spirit in the soul.” He rightly observes that Aquinas rejected Lombard’s understanding that charity was not a habit created in the soul, but the Holy Spirit itself. This is one of those many cases where the image we have of Lombard as the arbiter of theological orthodoxy may disguise the true extent of his originality. Although Hugh of St Victor developed the Augustinian understanding of the Holy Spirit as the mutual love of Father and Son, he may also draw much more than is realized on Abelard’s conviction that caritas was also the foundation of the virtues.

Lombard was still profoundly indebted to Augustine in his understanding of the reality of original sin. Rosemann makes a helpful point, however, in observing that there are many related issues on which Lombard refuses to come down with a definitive answer. This is precisely what made the Four Books of Sentences such a useful foundation text in theology. The sentences it presents are not just the views of Lombard, but the various authoritative views, sometimes mutually divergent, that could be held on an issue. Even though Lombard may differ with Abelard on a number of individual questions, he is indebted to Abelard for raising the issues that need to be discussed.

Lombard’s discussion of the incarnation is not easy to grasp if one is looking for a clear statement of an opinion. As Rosemann notes, the Lombard’s teaching that Christ, in so far as he is a man, is not a something [non est aliquid], was officially condemned by Pope Alexander III in 1170. While Colish goes to considerable length to refute the accusation and affirm the orthodoxy of Lombard’s teaching, these accusations should alert us to the hotly contested nature of Christological discussion in this period. His orthodoxy was only fully affirmed by the Fourth Lateran Council, paving the way for Lombard to become canonized as authoritative in the teaching of theology. Yet even though the fears that some held about Lombard’s Christology were unfounded, his presentation of a range of opinions that could be held about the person of Christ was still upsetting for some, who construed it as giving license to heterodox opinion. In affirming that Christ was not aliquid, Lombard was trying to respect the character of the dual nature in Christ, both divine and human. This issue of how we speak about Christ was one with which both Gilbert of Poitiers and Peter Abelard were concerned. Lombard is aware of the need to respect such Sprachlogik, while still retaining his sense of the transcendent mystery of the incarnation, as taught by Hugh of St. Victor.

Rosemann’s reading of Lombard’s understanding of sacraments as signs similarly underscores the extent to which Lombard develops the teaching of Hugh of St Victor in a conceptually significant way. Although he does not provide a detailed account of Lombard’s debt to previous thinkers on this, Rosemann does observe the importance of Lombard’s three-fold division into sacramentum, res sacramenti and res. In arguing that there is an objective res outside that which was signified by the sacrament, Lombard would create enormous problems for sacramental theology in subsequent generations. As de Lubac lamented, Lombard contributed to a tendency to make the Eucharist the corpus verum rather than the corpus mysticum, as in patristic teaching (in which the Church was the corpus verum). Abelard would not have agreed with Lombard’s identification of such a res as separate from the res sacramenti (in fact borrowed from the Summa sententiarum, now widely attributed to Otloh of Lucca). For good or ill, Lombard set sacramental theology on a route from which it would be difficult to move, without abandoning its fundamental semantic assumptions.

Yet there is an elegance to Lombard’s structure that is difficult to deny. Rosemann nicely comments on his understanding of the relationship between sacrament and penance, and the humanism that underpins his sense of the limitations of the human situation. At the same time, Rosemann rejects Colish’s claim (p. 163) that Lombard reduces confession and satisfaction to “desirable and recommended practices.” He insists that sacraments and external penance have a role to play. This may be another case where Lombard very neatly seeks to combine the best insights of both Peter Abelard and Hugh of St. Victor. He reconciles Abelard’s teaching that the sacraments are intended first of all to promote charity with Hugh of St. Victor’s conviction that it is only through sacraments that we enter the path to learning about and sharing in God’s nature. Peter Lombard was fundamentally more in continuity with patristic teaching than Peter Abelard on many issues, not least in his exposition of the last things. This is what made Lombard ultimately a more useful author to teach theology, even if he was less spectacular or outrageous in his pronouncements.

Rosemann’s monograph may not be as richly detailed as that of Marcia Colish, but it provides a useful introduction to an author who has suffered the fate of having been elevated to authoritative status in previous centuries. In his quiet, careful way, Peter Lombard is a much more interesting theologian than often imagined. His effective canonization at the Fourth Lateran Council has concealed the extent to which his authority was much more contested in the second half of the twelfth century than later commentators liked to imagine. Rosemann invites us to read Peter Lombard afresh, without the burden of taking for granted that he has authoritative status within Catholic tradition.