Peter Singer Under Fire: The Moral Iconoclast Faces His Critics

Placeholder book cover

Jeffrey A. Schaler (ed.), Peter Singer Under Fire: The Moral Iconoclast Faces His Critics, Open Court, 2009, 571pp., $59.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696189.

Reviewed by Fiona Woollard, University of Sheffield



Peter Singer is one of the most widely known and most controversial contemporary philosophers. He is a true practical philosopher, combining significant academic achievement with efforts to bring about real change in the world. He has made substantial contributions to the animal liberation movement and to the battle against global poverty. “The Singer Solution to World Poverty”, published in the New York Times Sunday Magazine, led to more than $600,000 of donation to Oxfam and UNICEF. Singer argues that common moral thinking vastly underestimates our moral obligations to animals suffering at human hands and to human beings dying in far away places. Put simply, Singer claims that the pain of the animals gives us conclusive reason to stop participating in practices like factory farming and animal experimentation. Equally, the suffering of people in the third world means that we have a moral obligation to donate most of our income to aid organisations. Even though many resist some of the more counterintuitive conclusions of these arguments, when it comes to preventing animal torture and encouraging efforts to end poverty, it is hard to deny that Singer is on the side of the angels. Although the actions he urges may not be morally obligatory, they are at the very least morally admirable. However, some other aspects of Singer’s views come in for serious moral censure. His advocacy of infanticide, in particular the infanticide of disabled infants, has led to fierce opposition and even violent attack. The phrase “moral iconoclast” is apt.

Editor Jeffery A. Schaler states that the aim of Open Court’s Under Fire series is to “present a picture of our subject, the ‘target’ as a philosopher in action, parrying multiple attacks by diverse opponents” (p. xxiv). Peter Singer Under Fire certainly succeeds in this aim. It begins with an intellectual autobiography in which Singer explains the interests and influences which have shaped him as a philosopher. The autobiography is followed by a selection of papers from critics and supporters and Singer’s responses. Most of the commentators are professional philosophers, but the volume also includes contributions from disability-rights activists Harriet McBryde-Johnson and Stephen Drake, and journalist Beryl Lieff Benderly. The essays are divided into four sections reflecting the main themes of Singer’s work: The Moral Status of Animals, The Sanctity of Life, Global Ethics and Ethical Theory.

In the Moral Status of Animals, Bernard Williams offers a challenge to Singer’s claim that preferential treatment of humans involves “speciesism” that is no more defensible than other prejudices such as racism and sexism, while R. G. Frey argues that Singer’s preference utilitarianism lacks the resources to arbitrate between human and animal interests.

In The Sanctity of Life, Don Marquis and Harry J. Gensler attack Singer’s positions on abortion and infanticide. Harriet McBryde Johnson’s lively essay reflects on her meeting with Singer and defends the rights of the disabled, arguing that disabilities do not in fact make life less worth living. Stephen Drake accuses Singer — and bioethicists in general — of ignoring the voices of people with disabilities and focusing instead on misleading quality of life predictions springing from the prejudices of medical professionals.

The papers in Global Ethics focus on Singer’s claims that those in the affluent world are morally required to make large sacrifices of money and time to reduce global poverty. In this section, I found Judith Lichtenberg’s “Famine, Affluence and Psychology” and Richard J. Arneson’s “What Do We Owe to Distant Needy Strangers?” most interesting. Lichtenberg and Arneson both agree with Singer to a large extent. Arneson offers a detailed defence of Singer’s claims against recent attacks by Garrett Cullity and Richard Miller. However, both Lichtenberg and Arneson try, in different ways, to soften Singer’s position. They both argue that assessments of an agent’s conduct may be affected by the moral code accepted in the agent’s society. In our current society, where it is widely accepted that we are not required to make large sacrifices to save distant strangers, it may not make sense to condemn those who fail to give.

Lichtenberg argues that we should focus not on how demanding our obligations are, but on understanding how we might motivate people to act differently. Drawing on experiments from situationist psychology that emphasise the way in which small changes in context can lead to significant changes in behaviour, she gives several practical suggestions about how this might be done. Arneson attempts to make Singer’s conclusions more palatable by introducing “consequentialist options”, retaining the thought that the moral status of an action depends on its consequences, but counting actions as permissible if the value of their consequences is close enough to the optimum. However, it is not clear that this strategy does succeed in significantly softening Singer’s demands, for, as Arneson himself notes, much of the behaviour of those in affluent countries lies far, far below the optimum and will thus be classified as seriously wrong on the option-consequentialist account.

Singer himself has emphasised that enforcing very stringent codes may be counterproductive, but draws a distinction between decisions about what we should require from others and decisions about what we ourselves ought to do — arguing that considerations about the counter-productiveness of stringent demands are only relevant to the requirements we place on others. Arneson challenges this, claiming

if a moral code is instituted in society, and internalised by its members, including myself, then that code guides my sense of what is morally acceptable and unacceptable for me to do. How can the code be irrelevant to the assessment of my choice of conduct as right or wrong and of me as culpable or praiseworthy for doing it? (p. 289)

Singer responds by claiming that his comments were directed to “someone who thinks for herself about moral issues” (p. 298). Such a person may be aware of the prevalent moral code, but her moral judgements are not determined by it. This discussion leads to interesting issues about the relationship between wrongness and blameworthiness, in particular blaming oneself. How far apart can holding myself to a moral requirement and blaming myself for failure to live up to this requirement come? Although we would all wish to be the kind of person Singer describes, thinking for ourselves rather than blindly following the accepted moral code, the prevalent behaviour in our society may affect how difficult it is to do what seems right. It may therefore affect whether it seems correct to blame ourselves for failures and thus whether we can truly be said to hold ourselves to certain standards or to see certain actions as morally required.

The section on Ethical Theory contains criticisms of Singer’s meta-ethical presuppositions from Michael Huemer, Marcus Düwell, David Schmidz and Jan Narveson. In “Singer’s Unstable Meta-Ethics”, Huemer argues that Singer’s meta-ethical views do not fit with other aspects of his moral philosophy. Huemer picks out two elements of Singer’s meta-ethical theory: (1) Non-cognitivism: the view that moral judgements do not make factual claims but express some other attitudes or issue imperatives; (2) Humeanism about Reasons: no consideration can function as a reason for action unless it is properly connected to the agent’s desires. Huemer argues that these commitments clash with Singer’s demanding normative judgements, make it hard for him to explain why we should try to fulfil these stringent ethical demands, and conflict with his methodology in normative ethics. Huemer argues that Singer should replace his non-cognitivist, Humean position with a rationalist intuitionism, according to which there are objective moral values, the belief that an action is objectively good can give me good reason to perform it, and we have access to facts about objective values through ethical intuitions (p. 359-379).

Huemer argues that Singer’s non-cognitivism is in conflict with his highly revisionary normative conclusions. According to Singer, many of our commonsense moral beliefs are wrong. We are wrong about our obligations to distant strangers and animals and about the permissibility of infanticide. However, Huemer claims, Singer’s non-cognitivism does not make room for this kind of error, because non-cognitivism does not recognise an objective moral reality that these common moral beliefs can fail to match up to. Thus all Singer can see himself as doing is expressing a set of attitudes that is different from those held by the majority (p. 364). Given this, it is hard to see why Singer’s moral judgements should hold any interest for the rest of us. We do not share the attitudes in question — Singer’s moral judgements are highly revisionary — and it is not clear how the mere expression of Singer’s own attitudes can have any purchase on us (p. 366). Moreover, on the Humean account of reason, trying to live up to Singer’s moral demands seems irrational. If reasons spring from desires, how could I ever have reason to make the sacrifices Singer’s ethical perspective requires? Singer attempts to argue that we have good reason to be moral because attempting to lead an ethical life provides a sense of meaning and purpose, and thus helps to satisfy the desire for happiness that most people do in fact possess. However, as Huemer points out, the stringency of Singer’s ethical demands makes the claim that holding oneself to these demands is the best route to happiness highly implausible. Huemer paints a dire picture for those who accept Singer’s ethical perspective: they must either fulfil the demands of morality, which will involve misery-inducing levels of self-sacrifice, or fail to fulfil these demands, which will lead to guilt and dissatisfaction at their failure to live up to the obligations they endorse. Neither path seems to lead to happiness (p. 368-9).

Singer responds to Huemer by denying that non-cognivitists must see moral judgements as mere expressions of preference or approval. Under Singer’s Hare-style non-cognitivism, moral judgements are prescriptions with a special form: they are prescriptions that are coherent, consistent and universalizable in the sense that we are prepared to hold them after putting ourselves into the position of all affected parties. Our moral judgements are mistaken when they fail to fulfil these conditions. This allows the non-cognitivist to endorse revisionary ethical positions. The universalizable prescriptions to which a person is committed may be quite different from his current preferences or the prescriptions that he actually endorses (p. 381-382).

Singer admits that we may not be rationally required to act morally. However, he notes, the Humean account does not imply that it is irrational to try to act morally. If I care very much about behaving in a way that can be impartially justified, it is rational for me to make great sacrifices to meet these standards. On the Humean account, no preference is irrational, whether it is a preference for my own welfare or a preference for impartial justification (p. 386). Moreover, he suggests, the prevalence of moral discourse suggests that we do care at least to some extent about meeting impartial standards (p. 389).

Singer emphasizes that acceptance of the ethical perspective is not an all-or-nothing choice. We can have a strong desire to act ethically, a desire that does affect our conduct, even if this desire is not over-riding. Singer describes Helen, who accepts that she is morally required to give most of her money away, cares about doing what is morally right, but has other desires including a desire to go hiking. She gives a lot of money away, but spends a significant amount — more than she could justify impartially — on travel, accommodation and equipment for her hiking trip. Singer claims that Helen can take satisfaction in her partial fulfilment of her moral demands — she is doing substantially better than most people — even if she recognises that some of her behaviour is unjustifiable. Greater levels of sacrifice are morally required, but are not rationally required (p. 389-390).

I find Singer’s description of Helen troubling. According to Singer, to act morally is to act in a way that can be justified impartially (p. 389). Singer claims that the impartial perspective gives equal weight to all sentient beings’ interests. We care about behaving in a way that is justifiable from this perspective of impartial concern, but this desire to be moral is one among many human desires. The perspective of impartial concern is very demanding, but we are not rationally required to live up to these extreme demands. We can find fulfilment in partial compliance. I cannot help hankering for more of a story. I want to know whether Helen has given the correct consideration to the perspective of impartial concern. Perhaps she has given this perspective as much consideration as we can expect. Given that she has only one life to lead it seems unreasonable to expect her to sacrifice all her life-enhancing interests to produce the outcome that is best from the perspective of impartial concern. Asking whether Helen gives enough consideration to the requirements of impartial concern assumes that there is another impartial point of view from which Helen’s behaviour can be justified. This point of view tries to balance the requirements of impartial concern with self-interest. It is still impartial, for it seeks to judge behaviour by universally acceptable standards. When I wonder if my behaviour is morally justifiable, I think I am asking whether it is justifiable from this overarching point of view.

Marcus Düwell claims that Singer moves illegitimately from the observation that moral language incorporates a concern for impartial justification to the substantive conclusion that morality requires impartial concern (p. 404-407). Singer responds by arguing that he does not make this transition without argument. He sees the perspective of impartial concern as the “first base” of ethical thinking, a simple universalization of self-interested decision making. Unless arguments can be given that other considerations are relevant from an impartial point of view, we should assume that impartial justification involves impartial consideration of interests (p. 421-422). However, the very fact that there is such a gap between the requirements of impartial concern and what it seems reasonable to expect people to do suggests that we should look for another way of understanding the ethical perspective. Singer may claim that there is no further impartial perspective, no perspective from which we can judge whether we have got the balance right between the requirements of impartial concern and reasons springing from our own interests. If he is right I am afraid I shall remain unsatisfied. I may be told that my conduct is wrong according to Singer’s morality, a morality that is highly demanding but with which we are not rationally required to comply and with which most people will not be motivated to (fully) comply. I still do not know how much weight to give this information when deciding what to do.

Peter Singer Under Fire shows the moral iconoclast defending some of the most controversial aspects of his account of ethics against some able and insightful critics. The criticism-response structure gives the reader a chance to see Singer clarify some common misconceptions about his views and to appreciate which objections are truly troubling. Accompanying Singer as he faces the fire is a good way to gain a deeper understanding of the views of this important philosopher.