Petitionary Prayer: A Philosophical Investigation

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Scott Davison, Petitionary Prayer: A Philosophical Investigation, Oxford University Press, 2017, $75.00, 189 pp., ISBN 978019975774.

Reviewed by Stephen J. Wykstra, Calvin College


This book is, as its subtitle advertises, "a philosophical investigation." Petitionary prayer is what the Apostle Paul enjoins Christians to do in Philippians 4:6: "in everything by prayer and supplication with thanksgiving let your requests be made known unto God." On a natural reading, this verse seems to suppose that such supplications can, sometimes at least, make a pivotal difference to God -- i.e., a difference such that, for at least some significant span of cases, were one to forgo the asking, God would forgo the providing. Or as we might (and Scott Davison does) for short paraphrase it: for divine provision of certain goods, for some significant span of cases, "God requires prayer." Davison's central question is whether, if there is a God of the sort posited by theism, this "God-requires-prayer" supposition makes sense. His clear, well-organized, level-headed philosophical investigation is rich in argumentative detail, both by its interaction with the past three decades of discussion of the question by philosophers of religion, and by the interesting ways Davison opens up the question by drawing on current views within mainstream philosophy of science and epistemology.

The ten chapters of the book, while not explicitly so organized, can be seen having four main parts. In the Introduction and first two numbered chapters, Davison gives a brief but winsome glimpse of the purpose and personal journey behind the book, followed by a more detailed explanation of the central question of the book, an overview of its strategy, and an analysis of the central notion of God "answering" prayer. In his brief window into his journey, we may see a tension, surely familiar to many of us, between two things: the yearning to find, in community with others, the love and power of God at work in tangible ways; and the equally persistent desire for a doxastic framework that is sober, sane, and analytically sustainable. While not conspicuous within the book itself, this tension motivates its investigation of whether petitionary prayer makes theistic sense -- an investigation, as Davison explains, that will need to reckon with some broad options within theism (Eternalism, Calvinism, Molinism, Open Theism, and the like).

Davison's strategy, as Chapter One explains, will be by way of "challenges and defenses." Challenges are arguments -- based variously on considerations of God's own attributes, of the natural world, or of the nature of created persons -- that petitionary prayer cannot (either unrestrictedly or for a restricted range of cases) make a difference motivating God to do something good that God otherwise would not do. Defenses are, in effect, proposed 'models' showing that this is entirely possible, given theistically-plausible posits about God and what we are otherwise reasonable in believing. A successful defense will make plausible that for some significant span of situations, given the theistic conception of God, it is indeed (p. 16) "within the space of God's reasons" for God to have (p. 21) "good reasons for [God's] withholding certain goods from created persons unless petitionary prayers are offered for them."

In Chapter Two, Davison seeks to clarify further the central notion of God's "answering" some prayer. While that notion may seem intuitively clear, giving a philosophical analysis of it is no trivial task. Davison poses important worries for earlier analyses, including a counterfactual dependence analysis, a middle knowledge analysis such as given by Thomas Flint, and Alexander Pruss's divine omnirationality analysis. To improve on these, Davison leans on the general contrastive model of explanation developed by Peter Lipton and others. After concisely invoking Lipton's model, Davison offers (p. 38) his own Contrastive Reasons Account:

CRA: S's petitionary prayer (token) for an object E is answered by God if and only if God's desire to bring about E just because S requested it plays an essential role in a true contrastive explanation of God's bringing about E rather than not.

On this analysis, I take it, God has "answered" some prayer by Sam for good thing G just in case three conditions obtain: (C1) God acted so as to bring about G (or some good suitably close to G); (C2) God had a desire to bring about G "just because" Sam requested it; and (C3) this very desire played an essential role in a true contrastive explanation of God's bringing about G rather than not doing so. Now C2 does not (as I first mistook it) require that God's only desire to bring about G is due to Sam's praying for G. It is instead (as I now see it) implicitly piggybacking on Pruss's omnirationality account by supposing that each action of God is grounded in a kind of divine maxi-desire (my term, not Davison's) that is a kind of vector sum of all God's mini-desires bearing on that action and its alternatives. C2 is then requiring that one of the component "mini-desires" for G is generated solely by Sam's prayer for G; and to this C3 then adds that God has "answered" Sam's prayer only if this divine mini-desire plays an essential role" within "a true contrastive explanation" of God's bringing about G (rather than not doing so). And here, I take it, the word "true" signals that C3 is a metaphysical requirement, not an epistemic one.

Davison's CRA is central to his book, and central to CRA is Lipton's model of contrastive explanation -- but on the latter, Davison gives little beyond one sentence (p. 51) quoting Randolf Clarke quoting Lipton:

To explain why P rather than Q, we must cite a causal difference between P and not-Q, consisting of a cause of P and the absence of a corresponding event in the history of not-Q' (Lipton 1991, p. 43), where a 'corresponding event' is roughly 'something that would bear the same relation to Q as the cause of P bears to P.' (Lipton 1991, p. 44.)

Taken (or given) straight up, I find this rather too concentrated. It drove me (as will I expect drive some readers) back to the horse's mouth -- to Lipton's 1991 Inference to Best Explanation, or to such sources as Michael Strevens's 2011 Depth: An Account of Scientific Explanation (section 5.6). There I gleaned a central aim of Lipton's model is to bring out how our explanatory practices are shaped by human interests. We typically pose our why-questions as contrastive questions, asking not just "Why P?" but instead "Why P rather than Q?" (e.g.,"Why did Trump rather than Cruz win the primary?") Here, Q -- what Lipton (Lipton p. 51) calls "the foil to the fact" -- is some rather particular alternative event that could have occurred instead of what in fact occurred (namely, P). It is our interests that shape which of the many alternatives we select as the foil. And this foil in turn informs what we offer as "the explanation." The explanation will involve two parallel explanatory narratives or stories (one for P and one for not-Q) where the narrative for P has a "switching event" that has no counterpart in the narrative for Not-Q. (The narrative is for "Not-Q" because in the "Why P rather than Q?" question, Q is an event that did not occur: the second narrative, on Lipton's account of the model, is thus for the non-occurrence of Q.) My foray into Lipton and Strevens did raise one worry: whereas Lipton's model takes foil-event Q as some particular alternative to P, Davison's applications of the model to prayer tend to treat Q as simply God's not bringing about the prayed-for good -- that is, as not-P. But this is problematic, for as Lipton notes (Lipton p. 49; cf. Strevens p. 177), if the foil Q were simply the negation of the fact P, the two narratives collapse into one -- for P and for not-not-P -- and the contrastive model becomes otiose. Here and elsewhere, then, we may best treat Davison's salutary use of mainstream proposals as springboards for further inquiry. This, happily, is how Davison himself (p. 6, p. 170) wants his investigation to be treated.

In what I call the book's second part (Chapters 3-5), Davison articulates what he sees as the strongest challenges to the "God requires prayer" supposition. Chapter 3 focuses on metaphysical challenges, with particular attention to a challenge arising from considerations regarding divine freedom. Davison canvasses some mainstream discussions of determinism and freedom with respect to human actions, using these to then contrast the main theological options regarding God's actions. On one voluntarist view, God has "strong libertarian freedom" at least with respect to choosing between various goods, in contrast to a necessitarian view such as Davison illustrates (p. 49) by quoting C.S. Lewis:

Whatever human freedom means, divine freedom cannot mean indeterminacy between alternatives, and choice of one of them. Perfect goodness can never debate about the end to be obtained, and perfect wisdom cannot debate about the means most suited to achieve it. The freedom of God consists in the fact that no cause other than Himself produces His acts and no external obstacle impedes them -- that His own goodness is the root from which they all grow and His own omnipotence the air in which they all flower.

Davison focuses especially on the challenge emerging from a voluntarist view, which he puts as an indirect proof involving a dilemma. Consider, on the voluntarist view, God's action of answering Sam's prayer for G, due to the switching event of Sam's prayer taken together with God's other desires/reasons relative to this action. The net desire/reason here either provides God with conclusive reasons to bring about G, or it does not do so. If it does do so, then God cannot be free to not bring about G (for an essentially rational agent cannot act contrary to what the agent has conclusive reasons to do). But if it does not do so, Davison says, then there must be some alternative sequence (and, on a fuller use of Lipton's model, some parallel explanatory narrative regarding the foil event!) "where God freely decides not to bring about G instead" -- and in which there must be -- by virtue of God's rationality -- "some other reason (or reasons) for God not to bring about G, on the basis of which God decides not to bring about E." But this, he argues, seems precluded by his Contrastive Reasons Account -- and perhaps also, I would add, by its underlying use of Lipton's Contrastive Explanation model, on which the switching event plays a role in the narrative for P with no counterpart in the explanatory narrative regarding the foil event.

Chapters 4 and 5 focus on whether one's typical epistemic situation could permit one (or others) to know that God has answered one's prayer for some good thing G for oneself or some other(s). Davison here draws on externalist conceptions of warrant from the 'discrimination" analyses of Dretske and Goldman, with special attention to the 'safety' requirement as found in recent work by Duncan Pritchard. Here the key challenge focuses on whether one could, even in cases where God has answered one's prayer for G, know that this is so. The epistemic challenge here is, in particular, in our knowing whether C3 of the CRA account is met: could we or the petitioner ever be in a position to know that some specific prayer or set of prayers for G has, as it were, made the crucial difference to God, playing an "essential role" in the "true contrastive explanation" of God's bringing about of G? On these matters Davison finds his conclusions not uncongenial with so-called skeptical-theistic modesty about our ability to grasp very much about God's reasons for the provisions God chooses to make or not make in response to our prayers.

In Chapters 6-8 (which I dub the book's third part) Davison discusses an important range of defenses aiming to sustain the God-requires-prayer supposition against, in particular, challenges appealing to divine goodness.

Chapter 6 takes its starting cue from Michael Veber's argument that a defense of God's requiring prayer must supply a plausible "morally relevant difference" between an actual world where God brings about some good for a person (say, by healing a severely-ill person) due to prayer made by another, and a nearest-by possible world where, on account of that prayer not being made, the ill person is not healed. Davison patiently interrogates a related cluster of defenses by Geoffrey Cupit, Daniel and Frances Howard Snyder, Alexander Pruss, Eleanore Stump, and Michael Murray with Kurt Meyers. In effect, these defenses posit as theistically plausible a range of ends that could motivate God's adoption of a certain general policy -- the policy, in at least some range of situations, of forgoing the provision of certain goods to creatures like ourselves, when the goods are not in appropriate ways requested by appropriate persons. On Stump's model, one relevant end valued by God is of a certain kind of healthy friendship with human persons: the sheer power-differential between God and humans, Stump argues, may require the specified policy so as to avoid the twin dangers of "overwhelming spoiling and overwhelming oppression." On Murray and Meyers' model, God values a certain kind of interdependence between believers so as to "foster a certain sort of unity" in the pursuit of God's kingdom-purposes. Similarly, Nicholas Smith and Andrew Yip's model finds as relevant the end of God's valuing having with human creatures a certain divine-human partnership. Patiently probing these models and others, Davison find them offering some help in "creating space within God's reasons" for divine policy by which prayer plays an essential role of the sort envisioned by his contrastive reasons account. But at the same time, he brings out a recurrent gap in the models: they fail to make clear that these ends are morally sufficient to justify God in forgoing the provision of the most significant goods.

In Chapter 7 Davison investigates whether the gap can be plugged by the "responsibility-based defenses" given by Richard Swinburne, Daniel and Frances Howard Snyder, and Isaac Choi. In a variety of ways, these authors seek to extend the plausible idea that the world is a better place if serious goods and evils depend upon our actions: granting this, the extension says the world may be an even better place if God adopts a divine policy on which our prayer-actions make a critical difference to what God does, thus extending the scope of human responsibility for what happens in the world. After gleaning from the mainstream literature some relevant distinctions regarding responsibility, Davison draws (p. 127) on H.D. Lewis's argument that it comports ill with God's goodness or justice to make the divine provision of "momentous things (like the recovery from illness)" depend on "the rather haphazard and arbitrary condition of being the subject of prayer." Pressing Lewis's point, Davison (p. 128) finds the problem severe enough that, in his judgment, defenses based on upon responsibility-extension alone "seem bound to fail."

In his important chapter 8, Davison tries out a new defense (I will call it his "extended autonomy defense") for God's requiring prayer. Focusing on "self-directed" petitionary prayer (for certain goods in one's own life), Davison first surveys recent proposals as to why certain goods within God-human relationships might make prayer an essential condition of certain divine provisions. Stump's "autonomy defense" urges that the most important of human goods -- above all, the good of our transformation into creatures who can enjoy friendship with God -- requires on God's part a particularly delicate interplay between divine sovereignty and libertarian human freedom: God, she argues, can bring about certain goods for a person only if that person gives God permission to do so by, for example, prayerfully requesting/inviting God to do so (or, on a middle-knowledge approach, only if God knows that were relevant circumstances to obtain, one would request/invite God to do so.) Davison finds that this model, when extended in significant ways (which include the possible divine valuing of certain kinds of non-libertarian freedom), goes some distance toward filling earlier gaps so as to make theistic sense of God's requiring prayer for a significant, but not unrestricted, range of cases.

Lastly, in what I dub the book's fourth part (Chapters 9 and 10) he brings his investigation to bear on practice. Given our considerable philosophical uncertainty or ignorance about whether prayer might make a critical difference in some cases, Chapter 9 considers the value of pragmatic "Pascalian" arguments. Here Davison also considers whether God might sometimes, for a certain classes of cases, both require and positively answer prayer in order to help someone's relationship with God, either so as to increase trust in God, or (as Murray and Meyer argue) increase that sort of dependence on God that is the spiritual antithesis of idolatry or self-worship. On all these questions, Davison manages to balance negative and positive, raising pertinent puzzles while highlighting answers that have some theistic plausibility.

In his final chapter, Davison takes an important last step that goes beyond, while building on, his earlier puzzles and insights. He proposes that it may make some theistic sense to suppose that whether God requires our prayers before providing certain goods may itself be a "case-by-case" matter -- where part of what God takes case-by-case "account of" is what some potential petitioner sincerely and non-culpably believes about whether his or her prayers will make a difference. I found this concluding suggestion an apt capstone to the balanced survey of challenges and defenses surveyed and probed by Davison's book. With its patient reckoning with the diversity of options within the theistic spectrum, and its complex interplay of worrisome puzzles and potential insights, Davison has given us a philosophically-reflective engagement with a theistic faith-venture. In an early footnote (p. 4), Davison winsomely speaks of telling his students that like Baskin Robbins ice cream, "there are at least thirty-one flavors of Christianity," and though not all would agree, "perhaps mine is another one." In Davison's concluding suggestion, as well as in the spirit of his overall analysis, lies the possibility that if there is a divine reality of the theistic sort, this reality may value our spiritual diversity far more than is dreamt of by any cookie-cutter approach to prayer and to the spiritual yearning from which it flows.