Phantasia in Aristotle's Ethics: Reception in the Arabic, Greek, Hebrew and Latin Traditions

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Jakob Leth Fink (ed.), Phantasia in Aristotle's Ethics: Reception in the Arabic, Greek, Hebrew and Latin Traditions, Bloomsbury, 2019, 175pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350028005.

Reviewed by Stephen R. Ogden, The Catholic University of America


This is an interesting collection which features three nested levels of increasing focus: the ancient and medieval reception of Aristotle's Ethics; the psychological notion of phantasia (often translated as "imagination") within that reception; and, most specifically and principally, how phantasia may (or may not) play a role in Nicomachean Ethics (NE) 6.5, especially 1140b17-18. This passage states that the moral "principle does not immediately appear (euthus ou phainetai archē) to the person who has been corrupted by pleasure or pain" (transl. from the editor, Jakob Leth Fink, p. 2). Since the moral principle here is the goal or end (to hou heneka, 1140b16-17), Iacopo Costa in his chapter helpfully labels this key text the "goal's destruction (or disappearance) passage (GDP)" (p. 80). I will continue to use this GDP abbreviation, with apologies to the economists.

The range of material is one of the volume's greatest strengths. As the subtitle announces, it addresses the reception of phantasia and the GDP in the Arabic, Greek (including Byzantine), Hebrew, and Latin traditions, as well as the cross-pollination among these streams. The first level of the NE's general reception is somewhat eschewed by Fink and Jessica Moss, co-authors of Ch. 1 ("Introduction"); however, most of the chapters contain some of the pertinent background information on the NE as a whole within the various traditions, without subsuming the book's more specific aims.[1]

What is more, the volume is not a mere NE museum. Fink and the other authors are keen on how past thinkers might aid our interpretation of Aristotle today, revealing the NE's contemporary philosophical value. The book contributes to a body of recent fruitful work on the intersection of Aristotelian ethics and psychology by Moss and others (such as David Charles, Hendrik Lorenz, and Klaus Corcilius). Each chapter definitely helped me to see the importance and difficulty of interpreting the central GDP and the place of phantasia in the complex web of Aristotle's ethics, as it connects to phronēsis (practical wisdom), akrasia, the so-called practical syllogism, etc. All this is no small feat, especially for a relatively short book.

But the scope, even confined to the lowest two levels, proves double-edged. Fink and Moss are aware of the challenge: to speak to phantasia's ethical role more widely in these traditions, all the while concentrating on eleven words (!) in the GDP (p. 1).

In my view, the collection is hampered when this narrow focus on the GDP (about which commentators are often taciturn) meets a misleading interpretive lens. Based on the GDP, nearly all the ancient and medieval (as well as contemporary) commentaries are branded as 'intellectual' readings, while Fink and Moss exemplify an alternative 'phantastic' interpretation. Of course, they should not be blamed for devising this bifurcation since they are roughly following a similar established divide regarding Aristotle's view of emotions (p. 5) and the place of desire and intellect in determining our ethical ends.[2]

On the 'intellectual' reading, the GDP concerns a destruction of beliefs about the moral principle. Thus, the 'appearance' language in the GDP (and presumably in positive contexts wherein the principle does rightly appear) is broad and does not invoke the technical faculty of phantasia from the De Anima (DA), by which one has a "quasi-perceptual appearance [of something], . . . traceable to an actual perception of that thing or something similar" (p. 4). In contrast, the preferred 'phantastic' reading from Fink and Moss takes the appearance/disappareance of the principle to involve precisely and primarily this faculty of phantasia, rather than beliefs.

Fink and Moss's attribution of intellectualism to virtually everyone in the tradition (with the possible exception of Averroes) is largely accepted by the other authors.

I have three complaints about this setup. First, it makes it more difficult to see the point of Chs. 2-6 (on the 'intellectual' traditions) and their connection to Fink's own phantastic interpretation in Ch. 7. Second, it undermines the book's purpose to investigate the reception of phantasia in ethics. Since the tradition is almost entirely intellectual, the book risks looking like a study on a mere privation. Lastly, I doubt that the various thinkers canvassed in the book are intellectualists, even as I am skeptical of the dichotomy itself. Let me develop this third point further.

There are several basic reasons to be wary of the intellectual-phantastic distinction. Far from exclusively dividing these types of cognition, Aristotle famously argues that there can be no judgment (hupolēpsis) or understanding (noein) without phantasia.[3] In the case of NE 6.5, the relevant principles are of actions or things to be done (ta prakta). This would seem to involve necessarily some sort of future, prospective reference as well as desire, both of which rely on phantasia.[4] On the other hand, the GDP clearly concerns practical judgment (hupolēpsis, 1140b12-16) and the intellectual virtue of phronēsis, which is a rational state (hexis meta logou), albeit not only that (1140b28). Furthermore, Fink himself is sympathetic to 'third way' views, which might allow a combined intellectual-phantastic appearance of the principle/end.[5]

But even if the distinction were well founded, it cannot be supported by the weight the book places on the GDP. The intellectualist designation to most of the thinkers seems premised mainly upon whatever explicit comments they make regarding the GDP alone, while Fink's phantastic interpretation of the GDP rightly draws on a much larger amount of material both within NE and outside it, especially in DA 3.10-11. Obviously there are space limitations, but why not attempt to consult the commentators across this broader landscape of pivotal Aristotelian texts, including the DA, where possible?

Even as the chapters stand, most of them should be commended for compiling more evidence of phantasia's role than the authors or editor acknowledge. Averroes remains a standout (as Fink and Moss note, pp. 10-11). Yet, even Frédérique Woerther sells Averroes and her own findings a little short (pp. 55-56). More on this when I discuss the individual chapters below.

In sum, the book contains insufficient evidence for (and, indeed, counterevidence to) its claim that the ancient and medieval commentators are 'intellectual' to the exclusion of a role for phantasia. This is a missed opportunity, since all of us, including Fink, might have gleaned more about moral phantasia within these traditions. Nevertheless, Fink is right to conclude that the book should propel further research in this vein (p. 11), and, overall, the collection remains highly valuable.

Now I will discuss the individual chapters (2-7).

Frans A. J. de Haas's Ch. 2 ("'What Appears Good to Us' in Aspasius and Alexander of Aphrodisias") on the ancient Greek tradition usefully begins by further developing the GDP and several other related points in Aristotle's NE (e.g., the voluntariness of vice) and his wider corpus. De Haas introduces some important (loosely) intellectualist evidence in Aristotle and the two ancient commentators. He correctly underscores the dialectic with Stoics, and Alexander does seem more optimistic than Aristotle about our rational power to override bad habits (pp. 28-29).

Woerther's Ch. 3 ("Averroes's Middle Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics") is one of the best in the volume. She adeptly summarizes the textual vicissitudes and reception of the Arabic NE and Averroes's Middle Commentary on NE (MCNE): e.g., the latter is extant only in Latin and Hebrew. She also tells us exactly what a "Middle Commentary" (talḫīṣ) is, namely, a determination and summary of essential points.

Woerther then shows by translating both the Latin and Hebrew of the MCNE that the key sentence of the GDP gets garbled (probably a misreading of the Greek in the original Arabic translation) (pp. 44-46). It is slightly annoying that she translates the two instances of apparet as "is obvious" (p. 44) rather than "is apparent" or "appears," which would better fit not only the book, but also the translation of the Hebrew (p. 45) and her own explanation of the passage using "appears" (p. 46).[6] But perhaps she means to indicate that the verb in Arabic would likely not have been some form of ḫ-y-l (from which derives taḫayyul, the technical sense of phantasia).[7]

Woerther investigates six other relevant and intriguing passages. The final text, corresponding to NE 6.8 (1142a23-30), is definitely the most striking (p. 53). Aristotle argues, haltingly, that phronēsis is concerned with the last particular, which is somehow the object of sensation (aisthēsis): not the five special sensibles but more like (yet not exactly like!) the perception of a triangle.

Averroes clarifies:

I rather mean by this the power that perceives that the simplest figure is the figure with three angles, and it is the power of phantasia (phantastica). But the power of phantasia that makes us see what can be done (videre facit operabile) is closer to sensation than the power of phantasia in [mathematical] learning (doctrina).[8]

As Woerther notes, Averroes goes beyond Aristotle's text to introduce different kinds of phantasia (the "phantastic power"): one seemingly identified with the common sense (which perceives shape), and another associated with practical wisdom, which allows us to envision possible actions. This is a remarkable discovery from Woerther and for the volume, since Averroes is also dubbed an intellectualist yet clearly makes room for a particular kind of technical phantasia in moral action.[9]

In fact, though Woerther reckons the above text as an exception (p. 56), I think the other passages she presents provide more clues. For example, in the fourth passage considered (7.6, 1149a32-34), she fails to observe that in the Arabic NE and Averroes "reason and fantasia (al-fikra wa-al-fanṭāsīyā)" conjunctively inform anger of a slight, whereas in Greek either "reason or imagination" (logos ē hē phantasia) can do so (p. 51). Woerther's further comments on 'reason' (fikr) are confusing (p. 52). However, since even fikr, in Averroes's psychology, is not intellect proper (but rather something like phantasia insofar as it is informed by intellect), this passage seems to show that it is not intellect alone that informs anger.

Michele Trizio's Ch. 4 ("Eustratius of Nicaea on Nicomachean Ethics 6.5.1140b17-18") is a valuable inclusion of the medieval Greek/Byzantine tradition, though only Eustratius has left us with explicit commentary on the GDP. Eustratius utilizes more Platonic and Christian themes; particularly fascinating is his greater emphasis on the "eye of the soul" (cf. NE 6.12, 1144a29-30) (pp. 68 ff.).

Importantly, Trizio also presents Eustratius's commentary on NE 6.8 (1142a25-30) (pp. 73-75), the same text where Woerther finds Averroes's most unique comments. Eustratius (like many others) argues that the perception involved in phronēsis is akin to that of the common sense. This hardly suggests a solely intellectual appearance to phronēsis, and there are reasons to posit phantasia here.[10] It is surprising that Trizio is not more willing to explore these avenues and that the rest of the book fails to mention this passage in anyone besides Averroes.

One other small highlight from Trizio is his translation of euthus in Eustratius's version of the GDP as "straightly." The adverb normally gets translated as "immediately," but "straightly" (or "directly") provides an intriguing, if uncommon, way of taking euthus more locally.[11]

Costa's strong Ch. 5 ("Phronêsis, Pleasure and the Perception of the Goal") on the medieval Latin tradition showcases Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and Radulphus Brito. Like de Haas, Costa begins by unpacking additional relevant material in Aristotle's ethics proper, supporting a more 'intellectual' interpretation of phronēsis.

Costa is also to be thanked for his brief discussion about whether the GDP concerns the vicious or the akratic (p. 84). He argues that the disappearance of the principle could apply to either, which is instructive since his subjects go in different directions (Albert and Radulphus relate the GDP to the akratic; Aquinas to the vicious).

His explanation of Albert's account of the GDP and how the akratic's practical syllogism goes wrong is especially engaging (pp. 85-87). Even if one disagrees, this is another prime example of the kind of careful medieval analysis that contemporary interpreters might revisit.

Costa briefly summarizes Aquinas on the GDP (p. 87),[12] and quickly turns to his "theological works" (p. 88). This is not unwelcome, but ignores other important evidence in Aquinas. For example, Trizio already notes agreement between Eustratius and Aquinas on NE 6.8 (p. 75). And if we turn to Aquinas on NE 1142a25-30, we see that he (like Averroes) argues that phronēsis perceives through phantasia ("the interior sense by which we perceive imaginabilia") (In NE 6.7, §1214, Marietti ed.).

Costa finds a role for phantasia in Radulphus, too: because we understand with the assistance of imagination, the akratic's knowledge can be impeded physically when his imagination is "bound" (pp. 92-93).

Chaim Meir Neria's Ch. 6 ("Reception and Interpretation of Aristotle's Concept of Phantasia in the Hebrew Translations and Commentaries on Nicomachean Ethics . . . ") relates the Hebrew translation of Averroes's MCNE (along with excerpts from Aquinas) and a Hebrew translation of the NE by Alguades, made from Grosseteste's Latin translation. This chapter, thus, nicely overlaps with the preceding ones. The most interesting parts of Neria's chapter concern Joseph b. Shem-Ṭob's Hebrew commentary on the NE, especially his reference to Deuteronomy 16:19 ("for bribes blind the eyes of the discerning . . ."). One wonders if there might be any connection to the blinding of the eyes of the soul in Eustratius.

Fink's Ch. 7 ("Aristotle on Deliberative Phantasia and Phronêsis") is a welcome turn toward a more developed study of phantasia's role in phronēsis and the appearance of the principle. Fink is absolutely right to foreground deliberative phantasia in DA 3.11 (plus other passages that would otherwise go without comment, like NE 1140b28). Some issues seem undeveloped and hasty (e.g., that the principle's attractive appearance to the practically wise is a form of "tactile perception," p. 141). But, on the whole, I find Fink's account fairly persuasive and (as noted above) a seemingly holistic 'phantastic' interpretation that need not exclude intellect.[13]

Fink deserves praise for bringing together experts on these traditional strands in order to gain new and renewed insights on a lively topic in Aristotle. The book is sure to inspire other rich proposals (like's Fink's own) in which, hopefully, more credit will be given to the subtlety of ancient and medieval commentaries.

[1] Fink's book certainly does not attempt to cover the same ground as J. Miller (ed.), The Reception of Aristotle's Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2013. Yet, in addition to some background, Fink's book boasts useful supplements to some of the inevitable gaps in Miller's collection: e.g., Averroes (Ibn Rushd) from the Arabic tradition (in Woerther's chapter); the early fourteenth century commentary of Radulphus Brito (Costa); the fifteenth century heyday of the NE in the Hebrew tradition (Neria); the Byzantine tradition (Trizio).

[2] Though Moss herself is a major player in these debates, especially in her Aristotle on the Apparent Good, Oxford University Press, 2012.

[3] DA 427b14-16 and 431a16-17. Also De Mem. 449b32-450a1, etc. See de Haas's useful reminder of this (p. 16).

[4] See DA 3.10-11, esp. 433b27-29, and D. Frede, "The Cognitive Role of Phantasia," in Essays on Aristotle's De Anima, M. Nussbaum and A.O. Rorty (eds.), Oxford University Press, 1992, especially pp. 288-289.

[5] See Fink's comments, pp. 127-128, and n. 2 (p. 144), where he refers to the work of David Charles. See also pp. 133-134.

[6] Similarly, Neria translates dimyon -- often used for 'imagination' (see Woerther, pp. 48 ff.) -- in the Hebrew NE, as "estimation," without comment (p. 109).

[7] Note a small error in n. 22 (p. 59), where the Arabic for phronēsis should not be taḫayyul (phantasia) but probably taʿaqqul (a common translation of phronēsis, including in the Arabic NE).

[8] Quoted on p. 53, Latin in n. 49 (pp. 63-64); translation slightly modified.

[9] See Fink and Moss (pp. 8-9) and Woerther (pp. 54-56).

[10] One might object that the 6.8 text seems more concerned with phronēsis's grasp of particular things towards the end, rather than the end/principle itself. But it would take more work to show that phronēsis does not use this perception or phantasia when envisioning the principle also. Whether and to what degree phronēsis grasps the end is highly debated, though see Costa (pp. 80-83) for an argument that it does. Fink agrees (p. 140), and so does Moss, at least to some extent (Aristotle on the Apparent Good, ch. 7.5 and p. 224).

[11] Cf. Fink on translating euthus (n. 23, pp. 146-147).

[12] Indeed, Neria offers a fuller discussion of Aquinas in his chapter (p. 109).

[13] See Fink's sympathies with 'third way' interpretations above and his disagreement with Moss's "exclusively non-rational" phantastic interpretation (n. 13, p. 145). For a notion of rational phantasia (missing in the book), see U. Coope, "Why Does Aristotle Think that Ethical Virtue is Required for Practical Wisdom," Phronesis 57 (2012), pp. 142-163.