Pharmaceutical Freedom: Why Patients Have a Right to Self-Medicate

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Jessica Flanigan, Pharmaceutical Freedom: Why Patients Have a Right to Self-Medicate, Oxford University Press, 2017, 263pp., $39.95, ISBN 9780190684549.

Reviewed by Jonathan Anomaly, University of Arizona


Jessica Flanigan argues that prohibitive drug regulations are misguided, and that patients and consumers should have far more control over how much risk they're willing to incur in pursuing their medical goals.

It is a jarring fact that in order to access most medications, consumers in many countries first have to ask the permission of doctors. Apart from prescription requirements, consumers in the United States are prevented from accessing drugs deemed too risky by the Food and Drug Administration (FDA). Flanigan sees this prohibitive system as a clear injustice, and recommends replacing it with either a free market for most drugs, or with a system in which agencies like the FDA certify drugs that meet certain safety standards, without preventing people from accessing uncertified drugs.

Broadly speaking, there are two kinds of moral arguments for the current regulatory approach: that in the absence of prohibitions consumers are likely to harm themselves; and that they're likely to seek treatment in a way that unfairly harms other people.

Flanigan begins with a brief history of medical paternalism, including disturbing case studies of surgeons removing organs without bothering to ask patients first, and physicians deceiving patients about a diagnosis that they think patients are better off not knowing. As Flanigan emphasizes, the 20th century spawned a strange trend in the United States: at the same time that physicians and judges began to embrace the principle of informed consent, the domain over which patients could register informed consent shrank. So, for example, patients are permitted to refuse treatments, even when a predictable consequence is injury or death. But they are not permitted to access risky treatments, even when a predictable consequence of prohibiting access is injury or death.

The paternalistic case for regulating access to drugs often turns on a combination of empirical and normative claims. Roughly, the empirical claim is that regulators have epistemic advantages that consumers lack, and the normative claim is that a rigorous approval process paired with a prescription requirement helps guide patients to make wise choices.

Take the empirical claim first. Agencies are full of experts, and doctors usually have more expertise than patients, so they're in a good position to explain to consumers what the risks and benefits of various treatments are. The normative implication seems to be that this expertise will also help patients make the best overall choices. In general, the empirical claim is true -- at least as a generalization about the relative knowledge of patients and doctors. But the normative claim is less obvious, and even if it is true, Flanigan is skeptical that it justifies a prohibitive approach.

As Flanigan says, "Drug safety is not [just] a scientific judgment that requires medical training and expertise about the physiological effects of a chemical. Drug safety is a normative judgment that requires knowledge about how the risks and side effects of a drug fit into a patient's life as a whole" (p. 10). In other words, even if experts generally know more than patients, and it's advisable for patients to consult with experts before acting, this does not commit us to the view that patients should be forced to consult with experts before accessing a treatment, or that regulators should prevent patients from accessing treatments they deem too risky.

A further problem with a paternalistic approach to regulation is illustrated by the idea of learned helplessness (p. 40). Learned helplessness occurs when patients put so much trust in the regulatory system that they lose their capacity to make autonomous choices.[1] When we ask patients about the biochemical properties of medications they take, or the risks their medications pose, many of them probably don't know very much. But consumer ignorance may in part be a result of rather than a justification for a regulatory system that provides (sometimes false) assurances that any approved or prescribed medication is safe and appropriate for the patient. If so, Flanigan thinks, patients would be better off if they had greater incentives to inform themselves of the risks and benefits of particular procedures or medications they're considering.

In the middle of the book, Flanigan turns from paternalistic policies that aim to prevent consumers from harming themselves, to policies aimed at preventing us from harming others. Antibiotics and vaccines are two kinds of drugs Flanigan is convinced should be regulated because of potentially deadly third-party effects.

On Flanigan's view, restricting the use of antibiotics is analogous to requiring people to vaccinate themselves and their children. Both are examples of activities that pass the "regulatory reversal test" (p. 91): the failure of appropriate regulations in these cases predictably leads people to inflict serious harm on other people without their consent. Just as I have no moral right to spray bullets in the air in downtown London to celebrate New Year's Eve, so too I have no right to act as a vector for contagious viral infections[2] or antibiotic-resistant bacteria[3] that expose people to lethal risks.

Vaccines and antibiotics are easy cases, but Flanigan explores and objects to an egalitarian argument for regulation that turns on the relative or positional harms that arise when some people improve their own welfare by means of medical procedures that other people can't access. Some egalitarians worry that access to elite private schools or to expensive cognitive enhancers allows some people to gain unfair advantages over others, and thus should be banned.

Flanigan concedes that cognitive enhancement drugs and degrees from elite universities might confer big relative gains to the recipients. But she also emphasizes that having smarter people in a population produces broad benefits since such people are likely to develop the kinds of innovations that make the lives of disadvantaged people better (p. 93).

This response is similar to the economist's idea that we can have more inequality of wealth at the same time that we have more equality of welfare, or life-satisfaction. For example, if especially productive people figure out how to create new kinds of computers, how to cure diseases, or invent new sources of energy, this arguably benefits the poor the most, even if it also increases material inequality between the inventors of these products and everyone else.

It's an interesting question, though, whether Flanigan's argument would apply to genetic enhancements in addition to drugs like Adderall that have modest effects on performance. At some point, inequalities of ability may confer massive positional advantages to the enhanced, especially if access to the relevant treatment is expensive. While not all positional advantages should be thought of as creating the kinds of externalities that merit government regulation, very large differences in general intelligence or impulse control, for example, may lead to such different life prospects for some people that they regard the unenhanced as useless, even contemptible. Here Flanigan's commitment to strong individual rights (p. 94) distances her from consequentialists like Julian Savulescu,[4] and pluralists like Allen Buchanan,[5] who are more willing to endorse government subsidies for the poor to increase access to cognitive enhancements.

Still, Flanigan's argument that we should allow everyone access to enhancement drugs by removing legal barriers is likely an improvement over a prohibitive system. This is because when we prohibit the purchase of goods for which demand is inelastic, black markets flourish, and the harms of black markets are typically borne more by the poor than the rich, who can still find ways to access the goods that are banned.

In perhaps the most provocative part of her book, Flanigan argues that FDA regulators who enforce prohibitive policies actively kill patients. Flanigan recognizes that in order to show that FDA regulators kill people, she needs "to show that public officials who enforce premarket approval policies violate rights in ways for which they are morally responsible" (p. 114). But this is a difficult claim to demonstrate. In the absence of widespread agreement about the moral source of political rights, the reader might be less confident than the author is about the FDA's complicity in the death of patients.

Maybe Flanigan is right that those who enforce FDA restrictions are responsible for killing patients, but critics might respond that under any regulatory regime some people will benefit and others will not. If the goal of a just regulatory agency is to create rules that benefit most people, most of the time, so that everyone has ex ante reason to consent to it,[6] then enforcing regulations ranging from building codes to traffic laws "kills people" in the sense that enforcing those laws leads to some people dying and others living.

All of these regulations embody judgments about how to balance safety and efficiency. Many of them are plagued by problems like regulatory capture, so that private interests shape the regulations in ways that benefit themselves more than consumers. All of them are imperfect. Perhaps the best we can do is compare alternative institutional systems and see which perform best along various moral dimensions. In a sense, this is what Flanigan does, though at several points her strong conception of pre-political moral rights clashes with an approach that looks to the broader social consequences of regulatory regimes.

This is an engaging book on an important topic. It is a case study in how an informed and clearly articulated skepticism about current conditions can lead us to change our minds about regulations that determine who will live, who will die, and who gets to decide.


[1] This is a novel term for a phenomenon John Stuart Mill identified in the third chapter of On Liberty, where he argued that state restrictions might permanently stunt the growth of adults, rendering them like children when it comes to making hard choices.

[2] See Jessica Flanigan, "A Defense of Compulsory Vaccination." 2014. HEC Forum, 26(1):5-25.

[3] See Jonathan Anomaly, "Ethics, Antibiotics, and Public Policy." 2017. Georgetown Journal of Law and Public Policy, 15(2): 999-1015.

[4] See Anders Sandberg and Julian Savulescu, "The Social and Economic Impacts of Cognitive Enhancement." In Enhancing Human Capacities, edited by Savulescu, Meulen, and Kahane, Wiley-Blackwell, 2011.

[5] See chapter 8 of Allen Buchanan's Beyond Humanity? The Ethics of Biomedical Enhancement, Oxford University Press, 2011.

[6] James Buchanan and Gordon Tullock, The Calculus of Consent, University of Michigan Press, 1962.