Phenomenal Blackness: Black Power, Philosophy, and Theory

Phenomenal Blackness 1

Mark Christian Thompson, Phenomenal Blackness: Black Power, Philosophy, and Theory, The University of Chicago Press, 2022, 195pp., $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226816425.

Reviewed by William Paris, University of Toronto


Studies in Black philosophy or Black critical theory are increasingly concerned with the distinction between Black people and Black being. Put differently, it seems there is a tension between those who want to focus on the sociological experiences of Black persons and those who aim to elucidate the theoretical coherence of Blackness as a historical category. Research into the former need not make any appeal to a theoretical category of Blackness and may even assume that there is a fundamentally universal human condition that allows us to track the diverse experiences of oppression and discrimination that Black persons encounter in an unjust society. Meanwhile, those who are interested in the theoretical coherence of Blackness do not begin with Black people as a sociological reality, but instead attempt to develop an essentially unique hermeneutic for interpreting “Black being-in-the world” (2). Whichever side philosophers find themselves on in these debates, Mark Christian Thompson’s book is an important and provocative intervention.

The basic argument Thompson makes in this book is that for African-American writers and critics there was a “shift in methodological focus . . . in the early sixties, from sociology and anthropology to philosophy and critical theory” (1–2). The focus on sociology and anthropology can be found in the older generation of African-American luminaries such as W.E.B. Du Bois, Alain Locke, Zora Neale Hurston, and Ralph Ellison. In contrast, Thompson argues, younger figures such as James Baldwin, Malcolm X, Amiri Baraka, Eldridge Cleaver, and Angela Y. Davis sought to explain African-American expressivity by recourse to “an ontological argument and a mode of hermeneutical interpretation appropriate to it” (2). What the difference in methodology amounts to is the self-conscious attempt to develop a theory of the ontological foundations of Blackness and thereupon construct a specifically Black epistemology rather than assuming one’s ready to hand epistemic strategies were adequate for investigating the lives of Black people.

This shift was partially due to the changing intellectual environment of the 1960s where the works of Hans-Georg Gadamer, Theodor Adorno, Herbert Marcuse, Hannah Arendt, and Jürgen Habermas were increasingly available in translation (156). Each of the main body chapters of Thompson’s book connect the work of African-American intellectuals to these German philosophers. Thompson investigates the convergences with, and cleavages between, Baldwin and Gadamer; Malcolm X and Habermas; Ellison and Baraka with Arendt and Adorno; Cleaver and Davis with Marcuse. The intellectual breadth and sophistication of the book makes for difficult, yet rewarding reading.

Thompson interprets these African-American thinkers as more closely aligned with what is called “critical theory” than previous generations of African-American intellectuals. They are not only interested in the complex relationships of language, tradition, and music to social being—they also develop novel theoretical strategies for expressing the unique form of Black freedom that emerges from this social being. I take it that this generation of African-American intellectuals were interested in concrete, historically mediated freedom rather than a putatively abstract and universal freedom. For most of these thinkers, the form of this concrete and historically mediated Black freedom can be found in aesthetic production. For instance, Thompson, in a reading of Baraka and Adorno on music, states, “That is to say that for Baraka, whereas the blues may still encapsulate for dialectic African-American history and sociality in terms of their form and function as mutually constitutive and functionally identical, it is now also the embodied spirit of Blackness as manifest in its African origin” (76). Blackness, or Black social being, persists as a resource for creativity for African-American artists that connects them to an alternative form of social life, whether they know it or not. The upshot of this is a turn to aesthetics to ground social difference outside paradigms of resistance, domination, or subjection. Aesthetics shines a light on the form of Black social being that is not dependent on the inventions of race/racism that one finds in American society.

In one of the clearest formulations of this principle, Thompson analyzes the imbrication of race and language in James Baldwin. For Baldwin, on Thompson’s interpretation, the primordial significance of race is not to be found in biology, but in linguistic lifeworlds (33–34). One is “Black” not because of phenotype or the categories others ascribe to one’s body, but because of the language that precedes them. “Baldwin predicates racial being,” Thompson concludes, “as a historical reality on linguistic expression, whereby the individual subject is determined in her being by the social totality reflected by the language into which she is born” (36). The importance of language here is twofold. First, language is an intergenerational heritage that is a feature of all human sociality. Second, the historical variability of language means it makes salient diverse objects of social life for different groups of people. Language is more than a neutral tool that a speaker deploys in the world; it is what makes a shared world available as such. On Baldwin’s view, language is a precious gift whose loss would be the loss of a rich, historical lifeworld rather than the mere loss of one tool through which we can engage with reality. Thompson takes this to mean that “The task of the racially representative writer is to be aware of the responsibility her work carries in being responsive to the racial history present in language and shaping her reality” (34).

What Thompson uncovers with his intellectual history of this constellation of African-American thinkers is an important shift in the conceptual importance of the orator, artist, singer, and poet in the African-American public sphere. They do not immediately represent Black people, but instead try to conserve and promulgate Blackness which they take to be a necessary condition for any Black lifeworld. In the background of these discussions is the formal integration of African-Americans into the United States legal order. Of course, it would be overly simplistic to reduce the psychology and theoretical output of these men and women to automatic expressions of changing political conditions. However, it would not be too far off to say that the shift from Black persons to an autonomous form of Blackness was a complex response to the revealed shortcomings of long fought for legal equality. After all, social mores do not change overnight. Unemployment and police violence continued to afflict many urban centers where Black people lived. In addition to all this, liberals like Daniel Patrick Moynihan were beginning to wonder if the Black lifeworld of the family might not be a source of pathology and anomie. In the face of these persisting realities the turn to difference and theoretical, even if not practical, separation is a plausible turn of events.

There is another shift that Thompson does not remark upon explicitly, but which works in the background of the thinkers he has chosen to analyze. Most of their theoretical production emerged from major urban centers such as Los Angeles, Oakland, and New York City. The displacement of the rural South as the key frontier for Black struggle in favor of the urban North and West must have also been an important factor in the transformation of Black thought. When one reads the early works of Du Bois and Hurston one finds considered attention to the importance of Black rural life as well as the explicit exclusions many Blacks faced from legal rights and labor markets. The movement of significant Black populations to urban centers in the 1960s brought on a new set of problems that would not have been found in the pre-Civil Rights era South. Living in urban centers integrated many Blacks into the circuits of capital through either blue-collar work or the culture industry. Nevertheless, this integration did not protect many Blacks from continuing to experience exclusion into zones of precarity, unstable employment, and informal labor markets. To many of these thinkers, such a situation must have looked like another form of vulnerability and dependence. Davis seems to be speaking to this problem of ongoing unfreedom in her Lectures on Liberation at UCLA (133–134). There is only so much one book can do, but further exploration of this theme would have added to the richness of Thompson’s analyses.

The search for aesthetic autonomy appears to be an ambivalent response to the reality of inclusion-exclusion. Thompson glosses Baraka as thinking that if only one could extricate Black aesthetic production from the culture industry, then the true essence of Blackness could emerge: “Somehow, jazz artists are able to sidestep entirely the need to support themselves economically. In so doing, they maintain their standing as independent agents creating and supporting an economically autonomous art. In this respect, Baraka’s notion of aesthetic autonomy indulges in pure fantasy, as indicated by its use of heroin addiction to posit radical racial freedom rather than extreme dependence and destruction by means other than directly economic ones” (92). It is in passages like these that Thompson’s study shines. One might think that the turn to Blackness and aesthetics by these African-American thinkers was a retreat from socio-economic processes or at least a mystification of these dynamics. But Thompson’s close explication of these figures reveals that they were struggling with a rapidly changing American society. They were searching for a language or paradigm that would conserve some species of self-determination from the impersonal compulsion of capitalist transformation. That many of these projects that attempted to provide the ontological foundations for Blackness or Black-being-in-the-world became unworkable might, ironically, say something about Black-being-in-the-world. It is unstable, precarious, and protean. The dream of autonomy and self-determination may be just that: a dream.

The shifting character of Blackness or Black-being-in-the-world as a theoretical object or paradigm could not be more evident than in its entrance into the formal academy. What is most exciting about Thomson’s book is that his intellectual history makes it possible for us to better understand contemporary trends in Black philosophy and aesthetics. Scholars such as Hortense Spillers, Fred Moten, Saidiya Hartman, Christina Sharpe, Frank Wilderson, and Jared Sexton seem to be inheritors and innovators of the tradition set forth by the African-American thinkers Thompson discusses. Though Thompson does not address the impact of these discourses from the 1960s on contemporary Black philosophy, he provides more than enough material for us to begin a history of our own present. We could develop more sophisticated philosophical and genealogical reconstructions of patterns and currents in contemporary Black philosophy to better understand our moment. This is an exciting prospect that Thompson is in no way responsible for. Thompson’s book stands well enough on its own and is an important advance in Black intellectual history.