Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism

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Torin Alter and Sven Walter (eds.), Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism, Oxford University Press, 2007, 349pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195171655.

Reviewed by Katalin Balog, Yale University


Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge is a collection of thirteen essays on the nature of phenomenal concepts and the ways in which phenomenal concepts figure in debates over physicalism[1]. Phenomenal concepts are of special interest in a number of ways. First, they refer to phenomenal experiences, and the qualitative character of those experiences (aka "qualia") the metaphysical status of which is hotly debated. In Thomas Nagel's nice phrase, "there is something it's like" to have a phenomenal experience and this "something it's like" is the phenomenal character of the experience. Phenomenal experiences strike many philosophers as problematic and difficult to accommodate within a physicalistic metaphysics. There are recent arguments, originating in Descartes' famous conceivability argument, that purport to show that phenomenal experience is irreducibly non-physical.[2] Second, phenomenal concepts are widely thought to be special and unique among concepts. Both the anti-physicalist arguments and physicalist replies to these arguments turn on views about the nature of phenomenal concepts. The non-physicalists explain our special grasp of phenomenal properties by going beyond the physicalist ontology, whereas many physicalists try to explain the unique features of our grasp of phenomenal properties by appeal to the unique features of phenomenal concepts. Most of the essays in this volume are engaged (pro or con) with anti-physicalist arguments and the role phenomenal concepts play in these arguments.

All but one of the essays -- Ned Block's -- are first published here and they represent some of the best recent thought on these issues. The book is divided into two parts. Part One is entitled "Phenomenal Knowledge" and it contains essays on Frank Jackson's Knowledge Argument. These are physicalist responses to the Knowledge Argument (by Dennett, Nemirow, and the recently turned physicalist Jackson himself) with the exception of Alter's essay, which argues that Jackson's recent way of answering the argument doesn't work, and Nordby's essay, which looks at the thought-experiment underlying the Knowledge Argument from the point of view of vision science (Nordby himself is a color blind color scientist being in a predicament somewhat reminiscent of Jackson's Mary, the protagonist of the Knowledge Argument).

Part Two, which makes up the bulk of the book, is entitled "Phenomenal Concepts" and it contains essays that propose different qualia-based anti-physicalist arguments (White and Nida-Rümelin), others that criticize these arguments based on theories of phenomenal concepts (Block, Hawthorne, Levin, and Papineau), as well as attacks on these critiques (Chalmers and Levine). Parts One and Two both contain essays exploring anti-physicalist arguments and the subject matter of Part One, i.e., the Knowledge Argument is not fundamentally different from the other arguments discussed in Part Two. Separating the two parts makes dialectical sense, however. The essays in Part One don't directly engage the problem of phenomenal concepts, whereas phenomenal concepts are cast in the leading role in the essays in Part Two. The issues discussed in the volume range from the nature of phenomenal consciousness and phenomenal concepts to the theory of concepts and the mind-body problem. Alter and Walter have contributed a helpful introduction, and put together an excellent collection that anyone with an interest in the philosophy of mind will find an essential volume to own.

Jackson's Knowledge Argument (Jackson 1982) asks us to imagine a color scientist, Mary, who has been born and raised and educated in a totally monochrome environment. She knows absolutely everything that there is to know about color in scientific terms but she has never actually seen any colors. One day she is finally released from the black-and-white room and encounters a red rose for the first time. Jackson argues that she learns a new fact about color experience she didn't know before (specifically, she learns what it is like to see red) and that consequently, given the assumption that she knows all the physical facts even while living in her monochrome environment, not all facts are physical.

This argument, along with the anti-physicalist arguments of Kripke 1972, Nagel 1974, White 1986, Robinson 1993, Bealer 1994, and Chalmers 1996, has been the focus of debates over the metaphysical status of qualia in the past decades and spawned an enormous literature that -- as the present volume evidences -- shows no signs of abating. There is a recent anthology[3] devoted entirely to the Knowledge Argument[4], and two of the contributors here (Dennett and Jackson) appear in that volume as well.

Dennett, Jackson, and Nemirow present different physicalist responses to the Knowledge Argument; all of them are developments and defenses of earlier positions. Dennett, in an imaginative and entertaining paper called "What RoboMary knows", follows up on his earlier contention (Dennett 2004) that Mary doesn't learn anything leaving her black-and-white environment. Dennett has argued all along that we are not imagining Jackson's thought experiment properly, or rather, that we can't properly imagine a situation in which one has full physical knowledge concerning color vision. And since we can't properly imagine knowing absolutely everything about color vision, the intuition that Mary learns something that she couldn't have figured out in the black-and-white room is just a folk intuition against which Dennett places his own contrary intuition. Of course, if this is right, the Knowledge Argument doesn't even get off the ground -- no new knowledge, no reason to suppose extra, non-physical facts.

In the chapter in this volume, after a brief interlude involving Swamp Mary, Dennett gets down to the task of providing us with a positive account of how Mary can figure out what it is like to see red purely based on her impressively complete knowledge of the neurophysiology of vision. To this effect, he produces the case of RoboMary: a robot whose color vision is disabled (and then at the denouement enabled again). The point of taking a robot as protagonist is not bringing to the fore the lack of phenomenal experience in this creature; Dennett here seems to subscribe to the view that phenomenal experience, if anything, is some complicated functional state of the brain that we can share with robots. The point of the robot thought-experiment is then not to emphasize the qualitative gap between us and robots (there is none in Dennett's view), but rather to illustrate what it would amount to to know everything about the psycho-physics of color vision in terms of a simpler example. RoboMary's way of obtaining knowledge about what it is like to experience red consists in some complicated but feasible ploy to use her knowledge of color vision to put herself in the relevant experiential state; in the second version, to put herself not in the experiential state itself, but rather in the state she would be in after having undergone the experience.

This bifurcation points to a difference in knowing what it's like at the time one is having the experience and afterwards. Michael Tye 2004 argues persuasively but controversially (we'll discuss what is controversial about it shortly in our discussion of Nemirow and Jackson) that while the first is propositional, the second is an ability, or cluster of abilities. Without going into the intricacies, the supposed propositional knowledge one acquires at the time of having the experience is of the form "This is e" (where e is the phenomenal experience of red, and "e" is a phenomenal conception of e); or alternately the form "e is Q" where Q is the phenomenal character of experiences of red, and "Q" is a phenomenal conception of Q. (What a phenomenal conception is is explicitly discussed in a number of essays in Part Two; we will get to that issue shortly.) In contrast, knowledge of what it's like after the experience is gone consists in certain dispositions and abilities, e.g., the abilities to imagine and remember phenomenal experiences of different sorts.

Once put in this way, it seems clear that only the first way of knowing what it's like poses a potential problem to the physicalist. Only if what you learn is possibly a new fact about color experience should the physicalist be worried. If you are dealing with knowing what it's like that consists in a cluster of abilities (as is assumed in the second RoboMary thought-experiment), facts are out of the picture and there is no possible threat to physicalism.[5] It seems like overkill to proceed to prove, as Dennett wants to, that this ability can be acquired pre-experience. The kind of knowledge that consists in possessing abilities poses no threat to physicalism; and this is true independently of whether the abilities in question can be shown to be acquirable pre-experience. RoboMary and her amazing ploys are not needed here.

So let's look at Dennett's treatment of knowing what it's like at the time of having the experience. Dennett wants to persuade us that RoboMary (and by extension, presumably, human Mary as well) can, based on her scientific knowledge, induce in herself a phenomenal experience of red, and so can know what it's like to see red simply based on her knowledge of the psycho-physics of vision. Is this a good answer to the Knowledge Argument? It appears that, at best, it answers the letter of the argument but doesn't quite engage its core. The Knowledge Argument is neutral on the origins of our experience; it concerns the relationship between the knowledge that ensues upon having a phenomenal experience (construed propositionally by proponents of the argument) and (even complete) physical knowledge. Whether we can induce this state, and thereby also gain knowledge of what it's like to have it, doesn't in any way engage the question about the relationship between phenomenal and physical knowledge. That question concerns whether there are facts involved in phenomenal knowledge and if so whether these facts go beyond the physical. The dualist can agree with Dennett about the possibility of RoboMary's and even Mary's clever ploy and still can maintain that these cleverly induced states in Mary involve facts that go beyond the physical as evidenced by the intuition that Mary learns something new upon having them, that she learns something that goes beyond her knowledge of the totality of facts concerning the psycho-physics of vision, no matter how well she has digested her vast amount of knowledge. All Dennett seems to have accomplished is pushing the surprising moment of discovery to an earlier, prerelease point in time.

Because Dennett seeks to counter only the claim that Mary cannot learn, prerelease, what it's like to see red, he fails to examine the nature of phenomenal knowledge. Let's pause now for a minute to do this. As I mentioned, proponents of the Knowledge Argument understand it propositionally; but it is open to a physicalist to resist this understanding altogether. The Ability Hypothesis,[6] i.e., the view that knowing what it's like is simply an ability and involves no propositional knowledge of facts, even at the time of having the experience whose character one gets to know about, is one of the well-known responses to the Knowledge Argument. Laurence Nemirow's contribution to this volume, and, though less explicitly, Frank Jackson's paper, both subscribe to this view.

Nemirow defends this view with admirable resourcefulness, waging a battle against charges that the possession of certain abilities is not necessary for knowing what it's like (as in knowing what it is like to see a very fine shade of red, a shade so fine grained that one can't remember, imagine, or even recognize it after the experience is gone), or not sufficient, or neither. But no matter how successful Nemirow's dispositional account of ordinary ascriptions of phenomenal knowledge is, there is a flaw in this strategy, which mars his position. The strategy is only really successful if it comes coupled with a denial of phenomenal facts that Mary could come to know about, and that plausibly denies the existence of phenomenal facts and phenomenal character tout court. He has to maintain that phenomenal character is not a property of experiences; and a fortiori, that it is not an introspectable property of experiences. That is a radical and rather counterintuitive position to take. It seems obvious that we can and often do introspect the phenomenal character of our experience. As far as I can tell, Nemirow hasn't produced good reasons to deny it.

Jackson is another (recent) advocate of the Ability Hypothesis, claiming to have been converted to it via representationalism about phenomenal experience. Jackson has come to reject his own Knowledge Argument, originally on the grounds that we couldn't know about qualia if (as he suggested in Jackson 1982) qualia had no causal effects on our judgments. For a while he didn't quite settle on a diagnosis as to what exactly goes wrong with the Knowledge Argument. Since he has firmly believed all along that physicalism demands that all truths should be a priori deducible from physical facts, and he seems to agree that putative phenomenal truths cannot be so deduced, he needed to find a way to deny that there are phenomenal truths expressing facts about the phenomenal character of experience. He thinks he has found this way in representationalism and has been advocating this position in Jackson 1998, 2004, and his contribution in this volume. Jackson's views on qualia and representationalism are subtle and not easy to understand. I am not sure I have him right.

In Jackson 1998 he suggests that Mary doesn't learn anything new since "sensory experience is putative information about certain highly relational and functional facts of goings on inside us … its very nature is representational" (p. 419). This idea is further developed in Jackson 2004 and in "The Knowledge Argument, Diaphanousness, Representationalism" in this volume. He calls his view Strong Representationalism and it is a view shared by other representationalists like Harman 1990 and Tye 2000. At first he characterizes Strong Representationalism as maintaining that "how an experience represents things as being exhausts its experiential nature" (p. 57); but a few passages later he modifies this to the more plausible claim that

the content of an experience plus the fact that the experience represents the content as obtaining in the way distinctive of perceptual representation are what determines the experience's nature without remainder. (p. 58).

This is a well-worn and respectable theory of phenomenal character, but, as far as I can see, it is quite compatible with the idea that experiences have phenomenal character, and that we can have first person knowledge of this phenomenal character, e.g., as Mary does when she leaves her black-and-white room. Phenomenal character on this view, it seems, is representational character, and an experience's representational character is a real property of it. Jackson disagrees. He correctly points out that

the key question for whether representationalism undermines the knowledge argument is … whether the new kind of experience Mary has when she first sees red is a reason for her to enlarge the range of properties she holds to be instantiated in the world. (p. 63)

Jackson answers that question in the negative. And he answers it negatively by arguing not only that phenomenal character is not a "new", or non-physical property, but that it is not a property of experience at all. As he puts it,

The nature of experience qua experience is exhausted by how things are being represented to be, not by the fact that they are being so represented … properties of how things are being represented to be are not instantiated properties. (pp. 62-3.)

The only feature of experience available to Mary's introspection when she experiences red is redness itself, a property that her experience represents external objects like roses as having. Thus, advocates of the Knowledge Argument, in claiming that Mary comes to know an extra, non-physical fact by learning about the character of her experience, simply confuse "an intensional property", i.e., a property that experiences represent, with an instantiated one, i.e., a property that experiences have.

If this is so, representationalism indeed supports the Ability Hypothesis. Jackson seems to have come up with the missing argument for the Ability Hypothesis, i.e., with an argument for the denial of phenomenal facts. But how convincing is his argument? Not very, it would seem. Insisting that representing a rose to be red is not an instantiated property is extremely puzzling. It seems perfectly natural to suppose that representing red is a property of the experience, and, assuming representationalism, that it is the property Mary comes to learn about. And if that is right, then representationalism cannot explain away the intuition that Mary acquires new knowledge when she leaves her black-and-white room.

Torin Alter seems to have exactly this point in mind in his reply to Jackson in the volume, "Does Representationalism Undermine the Knowledge Argument?" Representationalism by itself doesn't address the Knowledge Argument, he argues, since it doesn't do anything to expel the intuition that even if Mary knows all the representational facts pertaining to visual experience -- assuming that they follow a priori from the totality of physical facts she is alleged to know -- she would still learn something new when released.

The Knowledge Argument and other anti-physicalist arguments, like the Conceivability Argument and the Property Dualism Argument, are in fact not unrelated. As Chalmers 2004, Stoljar 2005, and Byrne 2006 point out, the Knowledge Argument doesn't stand apart from these other arguments but rather stands or falls with them. All affirm the existence of phenomenal facts and phenomenal character, and they all rely on a premise about some epistemic or semantic gap between phenomenal and physical descriptions to argue for the ontological distinctness of phenomenal properties and facts. One of the most powerful physicalist responses to the Knowledge Argument -- as well as to the other anti-physicalist arguments -- is one that acknowledges the existence of phenomenal facts but rebuts the connection between epistemic gaps and ontological gaps. This strategy, dubbed by Stoljar 2005 the "Phenomenal Concept Strategy", is the topic of much of Part Two of the book.[7] Block, Levin, and Papineau in this book all follow this general approach. The strategy is based on the idea that to account for the epistemic/semantic gaps between phenomenal and physical descriptions we do not need to invoke the nature of phenomenal consciousness itself; it is enough to invoke the special nature of phenomenal concepts. To what extent this is possible, without an appeal to the special nature of phenomenal consciousness itself, is a key issue from the point of view of the ontology of mind.

So what are phenomenal concepts? They are the special, subjective concepts we apply to experience, typically as it is occurring. When I turn my attention to a nagging sensation in my shoulder at this moment, I can form the judgment "Q is the way my shoulder is feeling", where Q is a phenomenal concept. There is a sense that there is something special about phenomenal concepts and that it is very closely tied up with our understanding of the epistemic access they afford to qualia. When we deploy phenomenal concepts introspectively to some phenomenal experience as it occurs, we are said to be acquainted with our own phenomenal experience. Acquaintance is generally taken to be a unique epistemological relation that relates a person to her own mental states directly, incorrigibly, and, according to some, in a way that reveals the essence of these mental states.[8]

The special relation each of us has to our own phenomenal experience gives rise to epistemic gaps between the physical and the phenomenal; these gaps have been fashioned into anti-physicalist arguments. The Knowledge Argument is built upon the gap between phenomenal and physical knowledge. Nagel's argument (Nagel 1974) for an ontological distinction between subjectivity and objectivity is built upon a gap between physical and phenomenal conceptions. Other arguments are built on the conceivability of zombies, the explanatory gap, and the distinctness of phenomenal and physical modes of presentation. These same features of our relation to our own phenomenal experience have also been harnessed by the Phenomenal Concept Strategy in the service of refuting the anti-physicalist arguments. If the physicalist can give an explanation of these features that is compatible with physicalism, she thereby obviates the move to dualism in accounting for them.

In what follows, I am going to sketch some of these anti-physicalist arguments, so that we can get a clearer idea on what the Phenomenal Concept Strategy needs to accomplish.

Conceivability Argument

The conceivability of zombies[9], or some equivalent thesis, has been the key premise in so-called Conceivability Arguments.[10] A statement S is conceivable[11] iff it can't be ruled out a priori. Accordingly, zombies are conceivable since no phenomenal statement is a priori derivable from information couched in physical and causal terms. Some dualists claim (e.g., Chalmers 2006) that this sets phenomenal truths apart from all other truths; truths about water, or mountains, stars, or tables, are, on this view, a priori derivable from the basic physical truths. The other key premise of the argument is that if zombies are conceivable, they are possible. If, as it follows, zombies are possible, physicalism is false. Here is a simplified formulation of the argument:

1) If zombies are conceivable then zombies are possible.

2) Zombies are conceivable.

3) If zombies are possible then physicalism is false.

4) Physicalism is false.

Gap Argument

The Gap Argument[12] starts from the premise that there is no perspicuous explanatory relation between a physical description of a person undergoing some experiences, and a phenomenal description of those same experiences. The problem is related to the conceivability of zombies, but it can be stated without appealing to the notion of conceivability, or any thesis linking conceivability and possibility, and so has the advantage that it doesn't rely on any substantial assumptions about concepts and conceptual truths. It only relies on a contrast between the comprehensibility of the hypothesis that phenomenal consciousness is non-physical and the incomprehensibility of corresponding hypotheses involving properties figuring in the special sciences, e.g., heat, life, digestion, etc.

The key premise of the gap argument is that if physicalism is true there can be no explanatory gap between true descriptions of a phenomenon and some physical description of the same phenomenon. But, the argument goes, since there is an explanatory gap between phenomenal descriptions and any neurophysiological description, physicalism is false.

1) If physicalism is true there is no explanatory gap between true descriptions of a phenomenon and some physical description of the same phenomenon.

2) There is an explanatory gap between true descriptions involving phenomenal states and any physical description.

3) Physicalism is false.

Property Dualism Argument

The Property Dualism Argument[13] -- proceeding in a broadly Fregean framework -- assumes that modes of presentation have two roles to play simultaneously. On the one hand, they determine reference. On the other hand, they individuate concepts. It is also assumed that modes of presentation are properties of the concept through which the subject grasps the referent.

The idea is this. Psycho-physical identities, like "pain=C-fibre firing[14] (CFF)", are a posteriori and they link conceptually independent concepts. Proponents of the Property Dualism Argument also hold that the modes of presentation of "pain" and "CFF" are essential properties of the referent: being pain, and being CFF, respectively. But if pain=CFF were true, then the two modes of presentation would be the same. The crucial premise of the argument is, as White puts it in this volume:

A statement of identity that links conceptually independent concepts is true only if the expressions flanking the identity sign pick out their referents by connoting [having modes of presentation that are] contingently coextensive properties of that referent …[15]

If that is so, pain=CFF cannot be true.

1) A statement of identity that links conceptually independent concepts is true only if the expressions flanking the identity sign pick out their referents by connoting contingently coextensive properties of that referent.

2) Both "pain" and "CFF" connotes essential properties of the referent, being pain, and being CFF, respectively.

3) Pain is not identical to CFF.

Grasping Phenomenal Properties Argument

The Grasping Phenomenal Properties Argument, advocated by Nida-Rümelin (see her essay in this volume), is based on the notion of "grasping", which Nida-Rümelin defines as understanding "what having that property essentially consists in" (p. 307). Her thesis is that we grasp phenomenal properties via our phenomenal concepts in this sense. This is very much in line with the traditional understanding of the acquaintance relation. According to this understanding, in introspection we gain insight into the very nature of the property we are introspecting. This thesis is called phenomenal essentialism. Nida-Rümelin's other key premise is the Cartesian thesis of cognitive transparency. According to the cognitive transparency thesis, whether one grasps the same or different properties by different concepts is knowable a priori. Adding some further premises, and in particular the thesis -- equivalent to the zombie conceivability claim -- that physical and phenomenal concepts are cognitively independent, she concludes that no phenomenal properties are physical.

1) A person who grasps one and the same property via different concepts can in principle find out a priori that the two concepts are necessarily coextensive.

2) We grasp phenomenal properties.[16]

3) Every physical property can in principle be grasped via some physical concept.

4) For every physical concept, and every phenomenal concept, one is not in a position, even in principle, to conclude on a priori grounds that the two concepts are necessarily coextensive.

5) No phenomenal property is a physical property.

There is much interesting detail in the formulation and defense of all these arguments. White's and Nida-Rümelin's papers in this volume contain ingenious developments of their respective arguments, and some interesting discussion of the similarities and differences between the various anti-physicalist arguments.

Dualists take these arguments to have proven the falsity of physicalism and explain the epistemic gaps between phenomenal and physical descriptions via appeal to fundamental, irreducibly mental properties, qualia, whose very nature is to be present to the mind, to be objects of immediate awareness by acquaintance. The challenge to the physicalist is to give a satisfactory physicalist account of the nature of acquaintance and of the epistemic gaps between the phenomenal and the physical. A satisfactory explanation would be one on which the epistemic gaps, rather than posing a problem for the physicalist view, will turn out to be features the physicalist will expect to arise in our relation to phenomenal experience. On this view, metaphysical dualism is false; however, there is a dualism of concepts; phenomenal concepts are unlike other concepts in ways that have very significant ramifications for how we ordinarily think about the mind, specifically, they are responsible for our inclination to believe in dualism -- even though dualism is false.

The locus classicus for the Phenomenal Concept Strategy is Brian Loar 1990/1997. Loar suggested the idea that PCs are direct recognitional concepts. Abstracting from some of the details, what he seems to have in mind is that when a person is having a particular experience she can deploy a concept that refers directly to that experience, without the mediation of any physical, functional, or behavioral mode of presentation; Loar also tried to capture the special intimacy between phenomenal concepts and phenomenal states by proposing that the mode of presentation of a phenomenal concept involves the experience itself that the concept refers to. The idea is that this account of phenomenal concepts is perfectly compatible with physicalism and at the same time explains why zombies are conceivable, why there is an explanatory gap, and how psycho-functional identities can be true, even though the concepts flanking the identity sign both have essential modes of presentation. If this is right, the crucial premise (premise 1) of the anti-physicalist arguments will be undermined and the arguments rendered ineffective.

We can understand subsequent developments in the Phenomenal Concept Strategy as following out two different strands in Loar's original proposal. One kind of account elaborates on the idea that phenomenal concepts refer directly, so it emphasizes the special conceptual role of phenomenal concepts; the other tries to make good on Loar's suggestion that the mode of presentation of phenomenal concepts in some way involves the experience itself.

Levin in her essay in this volume "What is a phenomenal concept?" takes the first route: she follows up on Loar's suggestion that the directness of phenomenal reference explains the epistemic gaps involving phenomenal concepts and at the same time rejects Loar's other suggestions trying to explain acquaintance's more elusive characteristics. She suggests that phenomenal concepts are type-demonstratives without any mode of presentation at all. She thinks physicalists

should reject the claim that phenomenal concepts require some sort of "presence" of, or "acquaintance" with … the quality denoted, since this claim is backed only by the intuitions that they have already explained away. (p. 105)

Others in this volume (Block and Papineau) do follow up on Loar's suggestions to account for "acquaintance" by positing an especially intimate relation between phenomenal concepts and phenomenal states. The idea is that thinking about one's own current pain already somehow involves pain itself: Pain is its own mode of presentation. But how should this idea be best understood? As Papineau[17] points out, by 'mode of presentation' we cannot mean an associated description that we can already think and use to refer to an entity which has those properties the description attributes. That would be presupposing phenomenal concepts in the explanation of those very concepts. We have to think about the mode of presentation of phenomenal concepts in some other way.

Block and Papineau both propose variations on the idea that phenomenal concepts are constituted by the phenomenal experiences they refer to. More precisely, on this view, every concept token applied to current experience is constituted by a current token phenomenal experience, and -- on most versions of the constitutional account -- this fact is crucial in determining the reference of the concept. On this account, there is an intimate relation between a phenomenal concept and its referent. It is also a way of cashing out the idea that the experience serves as its own mode of presentation. Metaphorically speaking, a token of the reference provides the ink in which the token concept is written. What is special about phenomenal concepts then is that, in so far as they have modes of presentation, their mode of presentation has to do with the special vehicle involved in applications of the concept. That means, among other things, that phenomenal concepts simply don't have descriptive modes of presentation. It is possible to see how the story goes, according to the Phenomenal Concept Strategy. This view of phenomenal concepts explains both the conceivability of zombies and the explanatory gap in terms of the directness of these concepts (i.e., their conceptual independence from physical or functional modes of presentation). It also explains the "substantial" mode of presentation of phenomenal concepts -- i.e., the sense that the referent is somehow present in the concept.

Interestingly, David Chalmers subscribes to the constitutional account of phenomenal concepts (see Chalmers 2003).[18] Hawthorne in his essay in this volume questions this particular dualist version of the account. According to Chalmers' account, if two phenomenal concepts C1 and C2 pick out the same phenomenal state Q, the belief C1=C2 should be a priori. Hawthorne argues against this using a case of "dancing qualia", a situation dualists of Chalmers' sort have to claim is possible. Someone arranges Fred's mind so that sometimes he has identical qualities and sometimes different qualities, without him noticing. Hawthorne argues that even when the qualities are identical, a thought C1=C2 (where C1 and C2 are Fred's phenomenal concepts of the qualities he is introspecting) won't be a priori justifiable. Chalmers replies to Hawthorne's criticism on his website:

Physicalist versions of the constitutional account have problems of their own. Block in "Max Black's Objection to Mind-Body Identity" discusses the nature of phenomenal concepts in the context of the many versions of the Property Dualism Argument.[19]

if a token phenomenal feel does double duty … (as a token of an aspect of both the pain and our way of thinking of the pain), no extra specter of dualism arises. If the phenomenal feel is a physical property, then it is a physical property even when it (or a token of it) does double duty. (p. 17)[20]

There are many questions that the constitutional account raises for physicalism, but one is particularly urgent: how do phenomenal concepts come to refer to experiences that they themselves exemplify? How does the constitution relation determine or partly determine the reference of a phenomenal concept? The idea that it does seems strange since it is not the case for most concepts. The concept dog is not constituted by dogs, and the fact that the concept atom is constituted by atoms has nothing to do with why it refers to atoms. The problem of how phenomenal concepts refer is a pressing one for philosophers across the board; but whereas dualists can appeal to a primitive relation of acquaintance, physicalists are under a strict obligation to provide a naturalistic account, i.e., an account that appeals only to physicalistically respectable entities and properties.

Papineau 2002 put forward one of the most elaborate versions of the constitutional account. He suggested that phenomenal concepts are formed by prefixing perceptual experiences with the operator 'the experience… .'. He calls this the quotational account of phenomenal concepts. He hoped to give an answer to questions about the reference of phenomenal concepts by invoking teleosemantics:

We should also note that phenomenal concepts are compound referring terms (composed of an 'experience operator' and a 'perceptual filling') … . [A] causal or teleosemantic account of phenomenal concepts will view the contribution of the parts to the semantic value of the whole as depending on the systematic contribution which those parts make to the causes or biological functions of the wholes they enter into. (p. 117)

Papineau, however, in this volume, gave up the quotational analysis of phenomenal concepts -- though not the idea that phenomenal concepts are in fact constituted by exemplars of their referent -- and he now claims that the fact that phenomenal concepts are constituted by exemplars of their referent plays no direct role at all in explaining why they so refer (pp. 124-125). He now thinks that the reference of phenomenal concepts is simply determined by their biological function.

Two of the essays in this volume are critical of the phenomenal concept strategy. Levine thinks that accounts of phenomenal concepts that appeal to directness of reference or constitution falter on the fact that they cannot really explain the substantivity of acquaintance. Directness of reference doesn't in itself explain the substantive nature of acquaintance. Constitutional accounts try to explain the substantivity of acquaintance by appeal to the cognitive presence of phenomenal properties in our phenomenal concepts, which, in turn, is explained by physical presence. This last move, however, according to Levine, is bound to fail.

In a related vein, Chalmers poses an intriguing dilemma to the Phenomenal Concept Strategy. He argues that the phenomenal concepts posited by the Phenomenal Concept Strategy either are not physicalistically explicable[21], or they "cannot explain our epistemic situation" with regard to qualia. This would be devastating for the Phenomenal Concept Strategy since the very heart of the strategy is to offer an explanation of our epistemic situation with respect to phenomenal states that is compatible with physicalism. To get his conclusion, Chalmers argues for the following two premises, providing the physicalist with a dilemma (let C be the physicalist's account of phenomenal concepts, or the physicalist's account of key features of these concepts responsible for our epistemic relation to phenomenal consciousness):

1) If P&~C is conceivable, then C is not physically explicable.

2) If P&~C is not conceivable, then C cannot explain our epistemic situation.

Papineau in this volume takes up Chalmers' challenge (pp. 136-42), "[embracing] both horns of … [Chalmers'] dilemma" (p. 137). After clarifying what conceptualization of C figures in the premises, he explains that if C is conceptualized phenomenally, P&~C is conceivable, and if C is conceptualized physically, P&~C is not conceivable. The first follows from the fact that if C is a phenomenal conceptualization of a phenomenal concept, C will employ concepts of phenomenal concepts that are just as direct as Q in the identity statement Q=B (where Q is a phenomenal concept and B is a concept of a brain state). The second seems obvious given that both P and C are truths about our world conceptualized physically.

However, embracing both horns is not problematic as long as one doesn't affirm the consequent of 1 or 2, and that is exactly Papineau's strategy. Let's take the phenomenal conceptualization of C first. Papineau claims that C is physically explicable, in the same way as a phenomenal state Q is physically explicable (by, say, being identical to B). By "explanation", it seems, he means not an intensional relation between descriptions in different vocabularies tied to conceptual transparency, but rather a metaphysical relation of identity, realization, or supervenience (enough for the purposes of defending a physicalist metaphysics). On the other horn of the dilemma, Papineau argues that physical characterizations of C are able to explain our epistemic situation. On this horn, however, he doesn't repeat the move he employed in the first horn. In the first horn of the dilemma, Papineau was happy to accept that physical facts are explanatory of, say, phenomenal facts, no matter their conceptualization. He could just go on and claim that physical facts are explanatory (in the metaphysical sense) of our epistemic situation, no matter their conceptualization. Instead he argues that those features of our epistemic situation that the Phenomenal Concept Strategy needs to explain are fully explicable in functional terms. As he puts it:

physicalists should bite the bullet and say that the thing that differentiates us from the … zombies doesn't make any difference to the explanatory significance of phenomenal concepts.

This is to drop the idea that phenomenal concepts should explain the particular, substantial manner in which phenomenal states are presented via phenomenal concepts. Papineau seems to be implying that all there exists, and so all there is to be explained physicalistically, are certain functional properties of phenomenal concepts, i.e., their directness, and conceptual isolation. Our epistemic situation is fully explicated by these features of phenomenal concepts. On this view, perspicuous physical explanation of our epistemic situation is possible in purely physical/functional terms. This tallies with the fact that Papineau seems to accept the requirement of conceptually perspicuous explanation in the second (though not the first) horn of the dilemma. One might want to ask more about why he switched strategy between the two horns. It is not quite clear which conception of explanation is the right one in these premises -- i.e., in which sense of 'explanation' is the physicalist committed to explaining phenomenal concepts and our epistemic situation.

As this discussion goes to the heart of the mind-body problem, and as many of the questions surrounding it are as of now unsettled, it is likely that more discussion of this argument is forthcoming.[22] Some of the unsettled questions require purely philosophical treatment; however, one cannot help wondering if in the future psychology and neuro-science will not play a larger role in settling these issues.


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[1] Physicalism is the view that the world's fundamental ontology is physical and the best account of that ontology is provided by fundamental physics.

[2] Arguments along these lines have been proposed by Kripke (1972), Nagel (1974), Jackson (1982), Robinson (1993), Bealer (1994), Chalmers (1996) and (2006), and, in this volume, White and Nida-Rümelin.

[3] Peter Ludlow, Yujin Nagasawa, and Daniel Stoljar (eds.), 2004, There's Something About Mary, MIT Press.

[4] For an extremely helpful review see Alex Byrne's NDPR Review (2006), available at

[5] That is, assuming that the ability itself doesn't involve the ability to produce non-physical phenomena -- but a contrary assumption cannot be the starting point of an anti-physicalist argument.

[6] David Lewis (1988) is one of the early proponents of the view.

[7] The classic location for this strategy is Loar (1990, 1997).

[8] Martine Nida-Rümelin, in her contribution in this volume, formulates an anti-physicalist argument based on our supposed direct grasp of the essence of phenomenal properties.

[9] I.e., creatures that are physically exactly like human beings but lack any phenomenal experience.

[10] Arguments of these sorts go back to Descartes; contemporary versions are due to Kripke (1972), and Chalmers (1996, 2006).

[11] Chalmers (2002) distinguishes between two notions of conceivability: positive, and negative conceivability. For greater clarity and simplicity, we will rely on the notion of negative conceivability here.

[12] Levine (2001), ch. 3 formulates, though doesn't endorse, such an argument. The argument I suggest is rather colloquial and doesn't follow his more technical presentation.

[13] White (1986), and essay in this volume. A very similar argument was formulated by Smart 1959. He introduced his 'topic neutral analyses' of mental terms in response to this argument.

[14] "C-fibre firing" should be taken as a stand-in for whatever neural state happens to be the neural correlate of pain.

[15] White's formulation is a slight modification of this thesis; I left out this complication for simplicity.

[16] I am rephrasing her argument slightly for simplicity.

[17] Papineau (2002), ch. 4.

[18] Versions of this view have been proposed, besides Block, Chalmers, and Papineau, by Hill and McLaughlin (1999), McLaughlin (2003), and Balog (2006).

[19] See White in this volume.

[20] White has a response to Block in White (2006).

[21] Explanations that figure in this argument are, of course, constitutive, rather than, say, causal or teleological.

[22] See, e.g., a recent paper by Carruthers (2007), in which he answers Chalmers' challenge in a different way.