Phenomenal Intentionality

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Uriah Kriegel (ed.), Phenomenal Intentionality, Oxford University Press, 2013, 262pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199764297.

Reviewed by Alex Byrne, MIT


This volume contains twelve previously unpublished essays. The first, Kriegel's "The Phenomenal Intentionality Research Program", serves as a helpful introduction to the topic of phenomenal intentionality, which Kriegel explains as "the intentionality a mental state exhibits purely in virtue of its phenomenal character" (2). He traces the term to Brian Loar's "Phenomenal Intentionality as the Basis of Mental Content"[1] and Terry Horgan and John Tienson's "The Phenomenology of Intentionality and the Intentionality of Phenomenology"[2] and tentatively credits the idea to Brentano and his followers. Phenomenal intentionality should be sharply distinguished from "cognitive phenomenology", the sort of "non-sensory" phenomenology that some (including Kriegel) think accompanies conscious cognitive episodes such as recalling last night's party and wondering where the corkscrew is. The existence of phenomenal intentionality and the existence of cognitive phenomenology are independent.[3]

Enthusiasm for phenomenal intentionality has fueled what Kriegel characterizes as a "germinal research program . . . the Phenomenal Intentionality Research Program, or PIRP" (1). He associates PIRP with the following six theses:

Phenomenal Grounding: There is a kind of intentionality -- phenomenal intentionality -- that is grounded in phenomenal character.

Inseparatism: The phenomenal and the intentional do not form two separate mental realms, but are instead inseparably intertwined.

Distinctiveness: Phenomenal intentionality is special and distinctive, in that it has certain important properties that non-phenomenal forms of intentionality do not.

Narrowness: Phenomenal intentionality is narrow, that is, it is not constitutively dependent upon anything outside the experiencing subject.

Subjectivity: Phenomenal intentionality is inherently subjective: it is built into the phenomenal character of a phenomenally intentional state that it (re)presents what it does to someone.

Basicness: Phenomenal intentionality is a basic kind of intentionality and functions as a source of all intentionality. (5)

Since Phenomenal Grounding is the claim that phenomenal intentionality exists, it must be endorsed by any PIRPer. Kriegel adds a qualification to his statement of Phenomenal Grounding, namely that as he uses "grounding", "it could well be that the phenomenal property and the intentional property it grounds are strictly identical" (5). But later Kriegel writes as if the proponent of phenomenal intentionality holds that the phenomenal explains the intentional, which seems to commit her to their distinctness:

One consideration unlikely to win converts but central in motivating sympathizers is the idea that phenomenal intentionality is simply introspectively manifest: attending to one's stream of consciousness in the right way brings out that some conscious episodes are intentional, and intentional because phenomenal. (7, my emphasis)

Kriegel would have done better to distinguish, following Chalmers' "The Representational Character of Experience"[4], between two kinds of theories on which phenomenal properties are identical to intentional properties. On the first kind of theory, non-reductive representationalism, the relevant intentional properties are themselves explained in partly "phenomenal" terms -- for example, by appeal to "phenomenal manners of representation" Chalmers, 346-7). On the second kind of theory, reductive representationalism, the relevant intentional properties "can be understood without appeal to phenomenal notions" (Chalmers, 350). (Of course, this distinction is only as clear as the notion of the "phenomenal", but it is serviceable: Dretske and Tye are reductive representationalists, while Chalmers himself is a non-reductive representationalist.)

As one of the founding texts -- the paper by Horgan and Tienson -- makes explicit, only representationalism of the non-reductive kind is committed to phenomenal intentionality. A non-reductive representationalist may adopt the slogan "phenomenology grounds intentionality", and so agree in spirit with Phenomenal Grounding, not because she denies the orthodox view that the grounding (or "in virtue of") relation is irreflexive, but because, according to her, phenomenal items (perhaps "phenomenal manners of representation") enter into the analysis of the relevant intentional properties. Put in terms of grounding, she thinks that a certain phenomenal manner of presentation (say) partly grounds a distinct intentional property.

While Phenomenal Grounding is essential, the other theses are optional, although Kriegel suggests that "all philosophers who qualify as pursuing PIRP . . . would subscribe to most" of them (4-5). The volume is less focused on PIRP than it might have been. Some chapters concern one or another of Kriegel's six theses, but others are connected with PIRP only tenuously.

In "The Access Problem",
 Michelle Montague argues for what she calls the "matching view", that "for a perceptual experience to be about an object, there must be a certain degree of match between the properties an object has and the properties the experience represents the object as having" (29). Assuming that if one sees an object, then one's "perceptual experience" is "about" that object, then the issue could be illustrated with questions like: could one see a perfectly ordinary shed, even though it looks exactly like a pink elephant? This is Montague's main example, and according to her such a radical illusion is not possible (34). (For US readers: a "shed" is a small building, about the size of a juvenile elephant, and considered essential to the British garden.) If one is having an experience as of a pink elephant, on Montague's view one doesn't see the shed, no matter how the shed is hooked up to one's visual system; neither can one think a singular thought about it (42). She weaves a critical discussion of Evans on "Russell's Principle" into her case for the matching view. At one point she puts her main claim as: "being in visual contact with an object [e.g. the shed] does not entail that one sees it" (34), where "visual contact" is explained as the obtaining of certain "crucial counterfactual dependencies" -- for instance, if one were to move away from the shed, "the 'pink elephant' would appear farther away" (45). But this claim is too weak, since Montague's opponent could reject any purported reductive sufficient condition for seeing, and so agree that visual contact with the shed does not entail that one sees it. In any event, the connection between the matching thesis and PIRP is at best indirect.

In "Indexical Thought", David Pitt continues his well-known defense of cognitive phenomenology. According to Pitt, "thought content . . . is entirely phenomenal and internalist" (51), and "thoughts are objects of intimate acquaintance in experience . . . states of minds . . . and intrinsically constituted" (52). The "content" of my thought is supposed to be the "cognitive phenomenal type" of which it is a token (56).[5] Pitt thinks that this view is incompatible with the received view of indexicals, and accordingly his paper is largely taken up with the heroic task of undermining Kaplanian orthodoxy. He cleverly sets up the contest as a battle of "intuitions", which has the rhetorical effect of making a tilted playing field seem level. It is unclear, though, why there is any fundamental incompatibility. Pitt's "cognitive phenomenal types" are the mental analogues of sentence-types, for instance the sentence-type "I am annoyed". Since orthodoxy is (obviously) compatible with the presence and explanatory importance of indexical sentence types, it would appear to be equally compatible with the presence and explanatory importance of Pitt's cognitive phenomenal types, although there might be a residual terminological spat about how to use terms like "content". Pitt's main positive case for his view is not in the chapter, but is presented elsewhere.[6]

In "Phenomenal Presence",
 Christopher Frey
 argues for two claims. First, that "The representational features of experience . . . neither constitute nor explain phenomenal presence". Second, that "Phenomenal presence is not representational, but is nevertheless the minimal realization of experiential intentionality" (72). By "phenomenal presence" Frey means to pick out the way in which "the objects of perceptual experience", unlike the "objects of most beliefs and judgments" are "therepresent to us" (71). As part of his case for the first claim Frey tries to dispatch the suggestion that "to be in a state in which something is phenomenally present is to represent experientially that something is the case. Nothing more can be said" (82). He complains that the suggestion doesn't offer much of an explanation, but this hardly shows that it is incorrect. And if it is correct, presumably phenomenal presence is representational, contradicting Frey's second claim.

Frey begins his defense of the second claim by saying that it might "strike many as confused", since "intentional" and "representational" are often used interchangeably. He then attempts to "provide a characterization of intentionality which clearly distinguishes it from representation" (83). Simplifying somewhat, an intentional state is one that is "directed upon an entity . . . as an exemplar or instance of some general property" (83). Frey appears to take the key commitment of a representational view to involve "veridicality-evaluable" and "representational contents" (85). It is obscure why Frey takes his characterization of intentionality to lack this commitment, since one can sensibly ask whether the directed-upon entity possesses the relevant "general property": if it does, the corresponding state is presumably "veridical". Frey seems disinclined to explain intentionality in terms of phenomenal character, and his chapter offers no other support to PIRP.

In "Consciousness and Synthesis", 
Colin McGinn argues that "conscious intentionality has the power of synthesis, while unconscious intentionality does not" (95), which bears on Kriegel's Distinctiveness. Synthesis is a certain "operation" (94) of the mind that produces complex concepts from simpler ones, but not by, e.g., conjoining them. Suppose that necessarily all and only bachelors are unmarried men. Then, according to McGinn, the concept bachelor is not the conjunctive concept man and unmarried, but instead is "synthesized" from these concepts. Moreover, the concept bachelor is only a component of conscious thought: one can have an unconscious thought with the content that John is an unmarried man but not with the content that John is a bachelor. (McGinn would prefer to put this by distinguishing between the "analysed form" and "unanalysed form" of the proposition that John is a bachelor (93).) Unconscious intentionality is "just a conjunction machine . . . it cannot really form synthetic wholes" (95). It is not clear why McGinn thinks that the mind, let alone consciousness, is intimately involved with the proposition that John is a bachelor (alternatively, with either of its two "forms"). Suppose that Crusoe has always been in a vegetative state and is the only person who ever lived. In such a mindless situation the proposition that Crusoe is a bachelor is true. Indeed, the true proposition seems (offhand) to be nothing less than the fact that Crusoe is a bachelor, and facts in general need no assistance from any operation of the mind. It's hard to say how McGinn would respond since his chapter is by far the shortest at only six pages; he refers the reader to his Truth by Analysis (Oxford University Press, 2011) for more details.[7]

In "Constructing a World for the Senses", 
Katalin Farkas squarely addresses the existence of phenomenal intentionality, Kriegel's Phenomenal Grounding. Specifically, she attempts to explain "perceptual intentionality", understood as the sensory presentation of "an experience-independent world, including experience-independent objects and their experience-independent qualities", in terms of the "phenomenal features" of experience (100). "Experience-independence" is supposed primarily to characterize the way objects appear. Perhaps tomatoes are not in fact experience-independent, but at least (Farkas thinks) they "appear as experience-independent" (108). She takes pain as a foil: why do pain experiences, unlike tactile experiences, lack perceptual intentionality? According to Farkas, this lack is merely contingent. Pain experiences could have possessed perceptual intentionality, as is shown by Wittgenstein's thought experiment about pain patches. Under what conditions would we "speak of pain patches on the leaf of a particular plant just as at present we speak of red patches" (Philosophical Investigations, §312)? Just in case, Farkas argues, the phenomenal features of pain experiences were "organized into a systematic, cross-modally coherent and predictable order" (109). This Farkas calls the "structure" of the experience, and she proposes "that this is responsible for the phenomenal appearance of an experience-independent object" (109). The phenomenal features of experiences of tomatoes have the requisite structure, unlike the phenomenal features of experiences of red afterimages, but it could have been the other way around.

In "Phenomenal Objectivity and Phenomenal Intentionality", Farid Masrour seeks, like Farkas, to explain why "Perceptual experience has the phenomenal character of encountering a mind-independent objective world" (116). And he gives a version of Farkas's explanation: his term corresponding to Farkas's "structure" is "Schematic Dynamical Unity", which sounds Kantian, and that's because Masrour finds the view in the first Critique.

Setting the merits of the basic idea aside, one question for both Farkas and Masrour concerns their starting point, that perceptual experience presents objects as "experience/mind-independent". What does this mean? Neither Farkas nor Masrour is explicit on this point, but they seem to take experience/mind-independence to be relative to subjects, perhaps amounting to something like the following: object o is experience/mind-independent relative to subject iff o could exist without S perceiving it. To be sure, tomatoes are experience/mind-independent relative to me, and I can easily know that they are, but is this how they perceptually appear? If Monty the macaque sees a tomato, does it appear experience/mind-independent relative to him? Admittedly, it can be perceptually apparent (even to Monty) that a tomato has rolled behind a melon, just as it can be perceptually apparent that the tomato is round, but it is a further question whether it is can be perceptually apparent that one does not see the tomato.

The two chapters could be fruitfully read together, and it would be an instructive exercise to compare and contrast Farkas's and Masrour's proposals.

In "Phenomenal Intentionality and the Role of Intentional Objects"
Frederick Kroon takes up the vexing issue of what a PIRPer should say about singular perceptual reference. To take an example of Loar's (discussed by Kroon), suppose you see (apparently) some indistinguishable lemons, one after the other; sometimes you actually see a lemon and sometimes you hallucinate one. You say "That's yellow" after each apparent-lemon presentation. With respect to intentionality, your successive experiences are very different; with respect to phenomenal character, they are the same. (We can stipulate that what it's like to see lemon1 is the same as what it's like to see lemon2, etc.) Why doesn't this straightforwardly show that phenomenal character can't ground perceptual intentionality? Although Kroon is a PIRP sympathizer, he does not address this question head-on. Instead, he chiefly argues against the idea that in the hallucinatory case one refers to a nonexistent intentional object, as defended by Lycan and (on Kroon's reading) the early Husserl. (He could also have mentioned A. D. Smith's The Problem of Perception, Harvard University Press, 2002.) Kroon ends up with the view that "the narrow internal content of such apparently object-directed thoughts and experiences involve grounding presuppositions that make reflexive reference to relationships of acquaintance afforded by the experience itself" (149). As this quotation indicates, Kroon's discussion is intricate and eludes easy summary.

In "Unconscious Belief and Conscious Thought",
 Tim Crane 
argues for the following three claims:

(1) Block's notion of access consciousness must be understood in terms of phenomenal consciousness, and in this sense phenomenal consciousness is the more fundamental notion; (2) beliefs are never phenomenally conscious, though episodes of thinking are; (3) the sense in which thoughts and experiences are conscious is that they are both a certain kind of episode, that I call an episode in the stream of consciousness. (157)

Thus, according to Crane, thoughts and experiences are conscious in the very same sense. Further, since beliefs are never phenomenally conscious, it is pointless to try to ground their intentionality in their phenomenology, because they have none. Perhaps their intentionality is grounded in the phenomenology of other mental states, but it is unclear how such a view could be motivated. This sounds like bad news for PIRP (in particular, for Kriegel's Basicness), and indeed an opponent of phenomenal intentionality will find much ammunition in Crane's chapter. Crane might be read as disagreeing because he holds, with Pitt et al., that "there is a distinctive kind of phenomenal intentionality associated with conscious thought" (157), which suggests that he is a true believer. However, here Crane is just declaring his commitment to cognitive phenomenology, not phenomenal intentionality as Kriegel explains it. Crane uses "phenomenal intentionality" in a very broad sense, to pick out "intentionality that relates to how things appear" (157). In the course of his argument Crane inveighs against the widespread oxymoron of "occurrent belief"; it is alas too much to hope that this will do any good.

In "Intellectual Gestalts",
 Elijah Chudnoff argues for:

Phenomenal Holism: (PH) Some phenomenal characters can only be instantiated by experiences that are parts of certain wholes. (174)

And uses this in turn to argue for:

Cognitive Phenomenology: (CP) Some phenomenal characters can only be instantiated by experiences that are not purely sensory. (174)

Chudnoff motivates PH by Gestalt phenomena such as Kanizsa's Triangle:


The upper left pie in figure D appears as a circle occluded by part of a triangle, unlike the isolated pie in figure C. Chudnoff writes:

the upper-left-pie presenting part of our visual experience of figure D has a phenomenal character that only partial visual experiences that play similar roles in similar whole visual experiences can have -- and the same goes for the triangle-presenting part of our visual experience. The main reason for endorsing the phenomenal holist view . . . is the impossibility of imagining visual experiences having the same phenomenal characters by themselves or as parts of very different whole visual experiences. (179)

This is an example of how the innocuous-sounding word "experience" often comes freighted with suspicious baggage when it occurs in the philosophical literature. The way the upper left pie in figure D looks could be harmlessly recorded by saying that it produces a "visual experience as of a partially occluded circle". This does not license talk of "experiences" as particulars, as opposed to properties or states. One might conjecture that Chudnoff is assuming that "experiences" are mental events that have experiences as proper parts, as a seminar discussion might have smaller discussions as parts, either successively or concurrently. Further, he takes experiences and their experience-parts to be possible objects of attention -- at various points he instructs the reader to "focus on" these alleged items. If this is indeed Chudnoff's conception of experiences, it is not explained or defended.

Chudnoff then discusses a visually aided arithmetical "proof" (involving arrays of dots) that he takes to support PH for the special case where the "certain wholes" are what he calls "intellectual experiences". Examples of intellectual experiences are "intuiting that circles are symmetrical about their diameters" and "deciding to bike rather than walk to work" (182-3). It is a short step from this, Chudnoff argues, to CP.

In "Does Phenomenology Ground Mental Content?", Adam Pautz
 declares himself more PIRPish than not, but his sympathy is decidedly tepid because he rejects "prioritism", the view that "phenomenology is 'explanatorily prior' to intentionality", which he associates with Horgan and Tienson (195; see also 227, n. 5). He spends most of his lengthy chapter attacking two theses that fall under the rubric of cognitive phenomenology, rather than phenomenal intentionality. He defines "cognitive phenomenology" as:

the phenomenology (if such there be) that attaches to beliefs and other intentional states that is distinct from associated sensory phenomenology, where sensory phenomenology is understood broadly to include perceptual, bodily, imagistic, and emotional phenomenology. (196)

With that definition in hand, the first thesis is the "CP-existence thesis", that "there is such a thing as cognitive phenomenology" (196). The second is the stronger "CP-determination thesis": "for at least some cognitive phenomenal properties P, there is a unique content such that it is metaphysically necessary that, if an individual simply has P, then he has an occurrent belief (or desire) with content c." (198)

If the CP-determination thesis is true, and if an appropriate "in virtue of" could be added, this would establish the existence of phenomenal intentionality in the special case of cognition. Pautz considers and rejects various motivations for the CP-Determination thesis, for instance that it provides the best reply to Quine and Kripkenstein. He gives a battery of arguments against CP-Determination, and then some related arguments against the CP-Existence thesis. Finally, as if this weren't enough, he develops his own "phenomenal functionalism", inspired by Lewis's functionalism, which purports to reduce the intentionality of cognitive states to that of perceptual or sensory states. Pautz's chapter could be usefully read as a counterpoint to Pitt's and Chudnoff's.

The final chapter is Charles Siewert's "Phenomenality and Self-Consciousness", which is relevant to Kriegel's fifth thesis, Subjectivity. Siewert's discussion revolves around three claims:

The SRM (Self-Representing Mind) Thesis: Necessarily, a state c of a subject S is phenomenally conscious, only if S has the appropriate sort of mental representation of c.

The CO (Conscious-Of) Principle: One is in a conscious state c, only if one is conscious (or aware) of c.

The IC (Is-Conscious) Principle: Every state of being conscious of something is a conscious state. (243-4)

As Siewert notes, some philosophers (e.g., David Rosenthal) take CO to be initially plausible and use it to support SRM. CO and IC, on the other hand, are in tension, since they apparently lead to a regress:

(according to CO): if you have a conscious state c, then you are conscious of c. But (according to IC), your state of being conscious of c will also be conscious. And thus (applying CO again) one will be conscious of being conscious of c -- and so on, ad infinitum. (244)

Of course, typically those sympathetic to higher-order accounts of phenomenal consciousness happily reject IC but -- Siewert reasonably asks -- "why is CO such a rock solid first principle, while IC is so utterly dismissible?" (245). After canvassing the suggestion that the regress can be halted or rendered harmless "by saying that the conscious state in some way refers to or represents itself" (246), Siewert rejects CO while retaining IC.[8] To sweeten the pill he suggests various true but innocuous theses with which CO might be confused. (Siewert himself puts this differently, in terms of rival "interpretations" of CO.)

Siewert actually finds a grain of truth in the idea that "all consciousness is essentially consciousness of itself" (257), but that grain does not require "building some sort of self-consciousness into every moment of phenomenality" (255). Siewert's explanation goes by rather too quickly in the chapter, and (as Siewert says) is developed more fully in his "On the Phenomenology of Introspection" (in D. Smithies and D. Stoljar (eds.), Consciousness and Introspection, OUP, 2012).

Although Siewert does not mention phenomenal intentionality, his discussion of the attractions of IC in effect shows why a natural thought rules it out. Recall G. E. Moore's decomposition of a "sensation of blue" into "awareness" (or "consciousness") and blue; a "sensation of green" differs by having green for its second component ("The Refutation of Idealism", Mind 12: 433-53, 1903). There is no suggestion that a third component, for instance a "phenomenal manner of representation", is required to account for phenomenal character. In a slogan, phenomenal character = awareness + qualities. (On the face of it, then, this is a version of reductive representationalism -- see the earlier discussion of Kriegel's chapter.) Intentionality, in the form of awareness, is thus a crucial ingredient in phenomenal character: the direction of explanation goes from intentionality to phenomenology, not from phenomenology to intentionality. This is a simple yet extremely appealing idea -- it is, after all, G.E. Moore's. And if Moore's idea is along the right lines, then a state has phenomenal character "in virtue of" its intentionality: intentionality grounds phenomenology, not vice versa. But this is to say that there is no such thing as phenomenal intentionality.

Although Phenomenal Intentionality may, like Seinfeld, be about nothing, this is an interesting collection, and each of the chapters has something to offer. The book also illustrates how the phenomenological tradition is alive and well in contemporary analytic philosophy of mind.[9]

[1] In M. Hahn and B. Ramberg, eds., Reflections and Replies: Essays on the Philosophy of Tyler Burge, MIT Press, 2003.

[2] In D. Chalmers, ed., Philosophy of Mind, Oxford University Press, 2002.

[3] As defined, the existence of cognitive phenomenology is controversial; sometimes the term is defined more ecumenically with the result that the controversy is about the nature of cognitive phenomenology, not its existence. For the ecumenical definition, see D. Smithies, "The Nature of Cognitive Phenomenology", Philosophy Compass 8: 744-54, 2013; when the term appears in the book, it usually has the other narrower sense.

[4] In D. Chalmers, The Character of Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2010.

[5] A related view -- minus the claims about phenomenology and internalism -- is Scott Soames's account of propositions as "cognitive event types", in J. King, S. Soames, and J. Speaks, New Thinking About Propositions, Oxford University Press, forthcoming.

[6] See, in particular, Pitt's "The Phenomenology of Cognition, Or, What Is It Like to Think That P?", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69: 1-36, 2004.

[7] Soames (see note 4) also connects the metaphysics of propositions with psychology, although in quite a different way. 

[8] One prominent example of such a reflexive account of consciousness, cited by Siewert, is Kriegel's "Consciousness and Self-Consciousness", Monist 87185-209, 2004.

[9] Thanks to David Chalmers and Declan Smithies for comments.