Phenomenological Realism versus Scientific Realism: Reinhardt Grossmann - David M. Armstrong: Metaphysical Correspondence

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Javier Cumpa and Erwin Tegtmeier (eds.), Phenomenological Realism versus Scientific Realism: Reinhardt Grossmann - David M. Armstrong Metaphysical Correspondence, Ontos, 2009, 139pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380514.

Reviewed by Joseph K. Cosgrove, Providence College


It is refreshing to read the correspondence of two unabashed metaphysical theorists, Reinhardt Grossmann and David Armstrong, whose works bear titles like The Categorial Structure of the World and Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits (no fainthearted Towards a Theory of …). Grossmann and Armstrong were metaphysical hold-outs during times inhospitable to metaphysics, and the renewed respectability of metaphysics in the so-called "analytic tradition" today owes something to their example. The present volume contains the correspondence between Grossmann and Armstrong from 1976 to 1987, along with three appendices containing commentaries on each other's works, an able introduction by the editors Cumpa and Tegtmeier, and an informative preface by Armstrong himself. The volume is aptly titled since the principal points of contention between the two philosophers indeed seem to arise from Grossmann's desire, on the one hand, to accept the world in terms of its "givenness" in experience, in line with a broadly phenomenological approach, while Armstrong is less willing to afford the "world as given" this benefit of the doubt, preferring to remain philosophically within the horizon of what (modern) science can tell us. The correspondence in general assumes familiarity with Grossmann's and Armstrong's scholarly output, and specific books are referred to throughout. The volume should therefore be of great interest to scholars of Armstrong and Grossmann, although of lesser interest to those, such as this reviewer, not already intimately familiar with their work.

The main body of the volume is divided into three sections of correspondence, the first on the nature of universals as well as some broadly related ontological issues, the second on laws of nature, and the third on the nature of numbers. The best entrance into the material, though, is Armstrong's review ("Reinhardt Grossmann's Ontology," included in the appendices) of Grossman's The Categorial Structure of the World (1983). Armstrong notes that Grossmann shares the interest, characteristic of the "Iowa school" to which he belongs (students of Gustav Bergmann), in "study of the great dead philosophers," which expresses itself in "ransacking the work of previous philosophers … in order to lay them under contribution to the present."

The metaphor of "ransacking" also highlights, however, the relative absence in this volume of what one might call a genuine historical perspective. Perennial philosophical problems are discussed as if they themselves had no history, or at least as if that history could have little bearing on philosophy itself. This gives the philosophical exchange between Grossmann and Armstrong, to this reviewer at least, a sense of assuming a bit too much. Take, for instance, the evidently shared supposition that being is univocal. One might ask whether this assumption entails already having placed oneself in a particular philosophical tradition (Cartesian) to the implicit exclusion of others. After all, the very problem of being in the history of metaphysics could be said to originate with the Aristotelian idea of analogy ("Being is said in many ways"), and it is not chiefly a matter of our being free to ransack Aristotle as well, but rather of whether we imagine ourselves to have launched the investigation with a neutral concept of being when in fact we have not. At least for "phenomenological realism," one should think, attentiveness to the "things themselves" would involve attentiveness to those respects in which those things, philosophical questions in particular, exhibit an essentially historical mode of givenness.

Although the discussion proceeds at a high philosophical level throughout, this want of historical perspective is often felt. In the review just cited above, for example, Armstrong endorses Grossmann's contention that "it is not the task of ontology to decide whether there are such things as numbers. It is sufficiently obvious that they exist. The task is rather to decide what category numbers fall under, to declare their nature as one might put it." This is sensible enough, but certainly such an investigation of the nature of numbers must take its bearings from what we initially conceive numbers to be. Are they, for instance, collections of at least two countable things, as Western mathematics all the way from the Greeks until the late sixteenth-century conceived them to be? Or does "number" mean all the reals and imaginaries, such that the Greeks knew only about the "natural numbers," a subset of our own? But, of course, the Greeks knew nothing of what we call the natural numbers, since our "natural numbers" are symbolic entities (the "number 4" and the "number -4," for instance, are for us on equal footing qua numbers), whereas the Greeks' numbers were not. For the Greeks, accordingly, the question of the being of numbers revolved around the problem of unity -- what gives the counted assemblage of units its unity, such that we can say that it is a number?

Cognizance of the historical issues inherent in any philosophical discussion of the "nature of numbers" would have aided the section of the correspondence dealing with this topic, where, for instance, Armstrong suggests that numbers ("naturals, rationals, and reals") be identified with ratios holding between aggregates and units, while Grossmann conceives of numbers as quantifiers. As Armstrong observes, the notion of ratio does not seem to apply to rationals and reals the way it applies to "naturals." Just so, and perhaps this signals that there is no concept of "number" that could possibly encompass both what the Greeks called a "number" and what we call a "number."

Continuing with the sections in reverse order, the part on laws of nature is notable for its focus on the issue of the "necessitation relation," as Armstrong terms it. That is, laws of nature are non-inferential at the same time they exhibit real necessity. What kind of necessity is this? For Armstrong, such necessitation is to be understood in terms of causality, certified epistemologically by what he calls "perceived" causes (he mentions the sensation of pressure as emblematic of a perceived cause). Grossmann is not convinced, tending toward a more Humean view of laws in terms of material implication and arguing that on Armstrong's view, all laws of nature would be synthetic a priori truths. This discussion strikes me as quite illuminating, but again, any discussion of "laws of nature" implicitly takes for granted laws of nature as set forth by post-seventeenth-century science, and the analysis would benefit from some attention of how that science has approached the question of the relationship between laws and causality.

Take, for example, the law of gravity. In Aristotelian science, gravity was understood in terms of formal and final causality (tendency toward natural place) and the distinction between natural and violent motion, not in terms of "law" in the modern sense. Galileo, by contrast, is at pains to argue that while falling bodies behave "naturally," the phenomenon of fall (gravity) needs no cause ("cause" now understood in terms of an external agent). Thus Galileo understands gravity in terms of (mathematical) law, but not in terms of causality. Newton proceeds to reinterpret fall as violent motion, gravity now being an external force. Gravity is now both law and causal necessity. Then, near the beginning of the twentieth-century, Einstein reinterprets gravity once more, this time as law but not as causality (gravitational phenomena now understood as inertial or force-free motion through a space and time whose metric properties are affected by matter and energy).

It seems that Galileo, Newton, and Einstein respectively were able to reconceive the relationship between causality and law in just the way demanded by their historical moment. One would not have wanted Galileo to throw out the concept of "natural motion" (in favor of "efficient causality"), nor would one have wanted Newton to reject the concept of efficient cause ("force"). I am not suggesting that these considerations solve the philosophical problem of the relationship between laws of nature and causality, but only that they are surely relevant, or even essential, to the discussion, especially to anything we might call "scientific realism."

Finally, the volume's first section ("Universals") revolves around the question of the complexity of universals, with Armstrong on scientific grounds arguing for complex universals (something that seems simple, like the color red, is shown by science really to be complex) and Grossmann on phenomenological grounds denying them (red, after all, is seen as simple). This particular disagreement leads to a lengthy series of exchanges on Armstrong's and Grossmann's respective basic ontologies ("scientific realism" versus "phenomenological realism"). If "red" is complex according to science, and the world is, as Armstrong believes, nothing else than the "single spacio-temporal system" studied and known by science, then it follows that there indeed exist complex universals (or "conjunctive properties," if you will). In the latter part of the exchange Grossmann suggests that Armstrong's assertion that the world contains "nothing but particulars having properties and related to each other" is incompatible with the his assertion that the world is a "single-spacio-temporal system," since the latter (the physical universe known through science) contains less than the former (the world). Again, the discussion proceeds at a high level philosophically, and Grossmann's distinction between the world (ontological) and the universe (spacio-temporal) brings out nicely the difference between his phenomenological approach in contrast to Armstrong's "scientistic," as it were, approach to philosophy.

While the volume should be a great interest to scholars of Grossmann and/or Armstrong, this review would not be complete without its discharging the unpleasant task of pointing out the incredibly poor editing of the text. Virtually every page is replete with typographical errors or worse, such that I got the idea I was the first person to ever actually read the manuscript. It appears that a great deal of cutting and pasting was done in preparation of the manuscript and nobody ever proofread the whole thing, with the result that one repeatedly encounters missing words, extra words, or sentences that simply make no sense. To cite just a few examples: "Armstrong claims that his conjunctive universals are not entities in addition the conjunct universals." (10); "Indeed, you are the first explicit hyper-atomist about properties whom I have been encountered" (66); "Suppose, for instance, that the fact that red resembles orange than it resembles yellow has the form" (77). There is even an instance of a missing logical operator replaced by an empty box, as occurs when one word processing program is unable to translate a specialized symbol from another.

It is inconceivable that Armstrong and Grossmann, even in an informal correspondence, actually wrote this way (or even e-mailed this way, if they in fact were using e-mail in 1977, as puzzlingly suggested in Cumpa and Tegtmeier's introduction; e-mail at the time was not widely used outside the military), and even if they had, it should have been corrected in the editing process. A few errors/misprints of this sort are perhaps understandable in our current stage of transition to computer-based editing and publication, but the sheer superabundance of errors in this volume is simply inexcusable.