Phenomenological Reflections on Violence: A Skeptical Approacht

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James Dodd, Phenomenological Reflections on Violence: A Skeptical Approach, Routledge, 2017, 201pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415791892.

Reviewed by Ann V. Murphy, University of New Mexico


James Dodd's book continues an inquiry established in his previous monograph Violence and Phenomenology (2009), an inquiry into the meaning of violence. His earlier book engaged the contrast between the instrumental understanding of violence -- in which violence is assigned meaning in relation to the end it serves -- and the understanding of violence as uniquely constitutive of meaning and sense themselves. Like his previous book, this one is concerned with navigating the spectrum that lies between these constitutive and instrumental understandings and in exploring the nature of their interrelation. The subtitle of the book -- "A Skeptical Approach" -- is an important clue to Dodd's methodological orientation. On his account, instability in the meaning of violence warrants a skeptical approach, an approach that acknowledges the impossibility of neatly defining violence. By skepticism, he means

an exercise of philosophical imagination that projects from any belief, any articulated position, the possibility, even necessity of reaching for an understanding of the very opposite -- and then back again -- in order to avoid becoming the dupe of settled and transparent beliefs. (vii)

Dodd's skepticism is methodologically linked to the phenomenological method and a broad figuration of epoché, where epoché indicates "the refusal to over-commit to tendencies of conceptions that nevertheless remain influential, even compelling, in recognition of the inherent possibility that any such commitment will ultimately be challenged from within by the inevitable force of its opposite" (ix).

Dodd's analysis is generated by, and seeks to address, the problem that violence in its myriad forms is resistant to conceptualization: "Any reflection on violence faces the problem of its allegedly protean character, above all its relation to distortion, ambiguity and instability of form" (ix). Violence assumes an enormous diversity of forms, a fact that problematizes any attempt at definition. From a phenomenological perspective, the meaning of violence often exceeds the concrete manifestations of harm, outrage, damage, and disintegration that accompany it (4). As a philosopher, Dodd is interested in this tendency of violence to disrupt any assurance with respect to its intelligibility and definition. In his analysis, the problematic and slippery aspects of violence -- the resistance to being fixed, captured, isolated, and defined -- are theorized alongside Dodd's acknowledgement that "however protean, paradoxical, ambiguous, and indefinite violence may appear on the level of concepts . . . we should not lose sight of our fundamental and intimate familiarity with violence, which in the end cannot but guide or reflections" (6). In other words, for us, violence is both proximate and distant, intimate and foreign, banal and extraordinary.

The book is comprised of six chapters that are divided into three groups. The first two essays explore the conceptualization of violence and the relationship to nonviolence at play in these conceptualizations. The second pair probes the relation between violence and religion. Dodd is less interested in the idea that religion might motivate violence than he is in the idea that violence and religion might condition each other more radically. The third and final pairing examines the relationship of human existence to war. Together the essays do not aspire to present a comprehensive theory of violence; they are six independent philosophical essays that engage a range of authors and address the theme of violence from a multitude of angles. What unites them is what is singular to Dodd's authorial voice in both Phenomenological Reflections on Violence and Violence and Phenomenology: first, a methodological preoccupation with the resistance of violence to conceptualization, and second, an obvious sensitivity to the particular relationship that philosophy as a discipline shares with violence.

The first chapter engages Sartre's discussion of scarcity and violence in Critique of Dialectical Reason alongside Paul Farmer's discussion of structural violence and Pierre Bourdieu's account of symbolic violence. These accounts of violence all assign its meaning apart from subjective intention and volition. Instead they collectively situate violence in reference to historical, social, and political contexts. Circling the idea that violence is not best conceived in reference to action as either a result or a means, Dodd considers Sartre's claim that violence is a permanent historical ground that motivates a subjective perspective marked by internalized scarcity. Moving further to consider the accounts of structural and symbolic violence in Farmer and Bourdieu respectively, Dodd argues for the impossibility of differentiating between violence and those contexts in which it is enmeshed. Together the accounts of violence in Sartre, Farmer, and Bourdieu indicate that "in order to understand the meaning of violence, the focus cannot remain on understanding the human capacity to deploy violence, or even to suffer it, but must pose the more general question of the form that human existence takes in the experience of violence" (32).

The subsequent chapter on violence and nonviolence would make an important addition to many upper-level course syllabi concerning political philosophy, violence, and peace studies. Dodd first queries whether nonviolence has a meaning in its own right, apart from considerations of violence. Violence and nonviolence are typically understood as a co-constitutive binary, but he considers that nonviolence might lay claim to its own positive definition; it is much more than the absence of violence and could never be adequately understood as mere privation. However, this consideration of nonviolence is tempered by his suggestion that a sustained investigation of violence is requisite to the formulation of any argument against it. Nonviolence remains shadowed by, and must engage, a field of violence; it is realized as a "modality of force" that takes shape in a field marked by the permanent possibility of violence (53).

The following two chapters on violence and religion do not discuss the use of religion to justify various kinds of violence. On the thought of Emmanuel Levinas and F.W.J. Schelling respectively, these chapters make a case for the idea that "our experience of violence is rooted in the religious as a fundament of human existence, and that our experience of the religious is in turn rooted in violence as a fundamental element of the human experience" (13). Chapter Three looks to Levinas (alongside Sartre and Bataille) for an understanding of the radical symbiosis of violence and religion. Here Dodd examines a common root and horizon that religion and violence share: namely "the awareness of the fragility of things, the potential for the world to be torn asunder, to be refused, disrupted, and brought to an end; but equally how life can be lost, extinguished, and suppressed by the hegemony of a successful order" (87).

The chapter on Schelling will be of interest to those who research the philosophy of evil. Here Dodd is principally interested in thinking through the difference between violence and evil in spite of their ubiquitous comingling and even conflation. Reading Schelling, Dodd considers that violence "lacks the stability and reality" that is entailed in Schelling's metaphysics of evil. Violence, for Schelling, is at most a tactic. (106) Evil, as an inverted and degraded spirituality, has a positive depth to which violence cannot lay claim as it is only a temporary tactic whose spiritual intelligence is exhausted in technical and instrumental strategy. (ibid.)

The final two chapters concern the philosophy of history to a greater degree than the previous four. These chapters query the relationship between the constitutive understanding of violence and the realities of war, and more precisely the contemporary concept of total war. Looking to the historical examples of the Napoleonic Wars and the First World War, Dodd illuminates the complexity and inconsistency of the concept. Performatively these two chapters make good on the intention that he announced in his introduction: to explore various figures of violence with an eye toward their limits, their instability, and their resistance to conceptualization.

I'll conclude this review by briefly addressing the significance of phenomenology in Dodd's analysis, his understanding of his project's relationship to ethics, and finally his prioritization of the philosophical over the political.

In the preface, Dodd writes that "in violence, phenomenology is so to speak faced with something that seems to resist its own phenomenality, or that refuses to conform to the exigencies of essence and the stable patterns of lived experience" (ix). Phenomenologically, violence both generates and obliterates meaning in experience. The saturation of lived experience with various figures of violence -- our intimacy with violence -- undercuts neither its brutality nor our struggle to come to terms with it and to better understand it. These instabilities in our understanding and experience motivate Dodd's methodological turn toward skepticism. While he may not have put it quite so bluntly, there is a strong link in his work between intellectually rigorous skepticism and responsibility.

Skepticism ensures that we are not duped by violence. The "dupe" is a fairly prevalent trope in Dodd's work. His concern is that we are duped by violence when we submit to and reify a particular figure, concept, or image of violence, and in so doing fall short of our responsibility to be vigilant as to the myriad and protean forms that violence may take. For this reason, skepticism in the face of violence remains vital. Very early in the text, Dodd notes that the ethical impulse behind the book lies in the conviction that

such a skepticism would be devoted to cultivating a mode of philosophical inquiry that would proceed by showing how it is that our conceptual potentiality exposes us to suffering and doing harm, to the possibility of being unjust, to covering over and excluding the demands of alterity and the exigencies of understanding. (9)

In other words, the conceptual schema that bring violence to life for us will both illuminate and obscure, and we would do well to recognize "that our commitments are chronically opaque to us" (ix). We must be vigilant in regards to "the differential between what we manage to see thanks to concepts, and what demands to be seen thanks to life" (10).

These essays are unapologetically invested in considering what it means to think about violence philosophically. Dodd repeatedly touches on two main reasons for this: first, philosophy has a long and intimate history with the problem of violence; second, Dodd believes that philosophy has something specific to offer to the discussion. What is required is a vigilance that he insists is "explicitly philosophical, and irreducible to the sense of political responsibility and ideological commitment that otherwise serves as the touchstone of unity in many of our discussions of violence" (11). Several of the merits and liabilities of Dodd's book are tied to its unapologetic and explicit preoccupation with the philosophical and intellectual vigilance that the problem of violence today demands. Indeed his bracketing of the political is bound to provoke some criticism for obvious reasons: what good are philosophical musings on violence if they bear no real ameliorative force? But Dodd's refusal to subordinate the philosophical to the political need not be read as an assertion of philosophy's superiority or autonomy. Dodd nowhere claims that philosophical skepticism alone is a sufficient response to the damage, suffering and outrage that violence causes today. His claim is more modest: Philosophical vigilance is a necessary but in no way comprehensive response to the problem of violence in human experience, nothing more and nothing less.


Dodd, James. Violence and Phenomenology. New York: Routledge, 2009.

Sartre, Jean-Paul. Critique of Dialectical Reason. Volume 1. Translated by Allan Sheridan-Smith and Jonathan Rée. New York: Verso, 2004.