Phenomenology: A Contemporary Introduction

Phenomenology A Contemporary Introduction

Walter Hopp, Phenomenology: A Contemporary Introduction, Routledge, 2020, 323pp., $42.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780367497392.

Reviewed by David Woodruff Smith, University of California, Irvine


Walter Hopp's excellent book is an introduction to phenomenology in the spirit of Husserl's own conception of the discipline. I am reminded of Bertrand Russell's remark on A. J. Ayer's monograph: "A delightful book. I wish I had written it myself." What is insightful and delightful in Hopp's book is its dedicated focus on the problems of phenomenology, rather than the phenomenological tradition and its historical texts.

Phenomenology as we know it -- this "new science" of consciousness -- was launched by Husserl in his monumental Logical Investigations (1900-01). Hopp works chapter by chapter on particular philosophical problems, deploying concepts and distinctions he draws largely from Husserl. Only in the final two chapters does he round out his take on the Husserlian program of phenomenology per se. Not only is Hopp's book chock-full of interesting pieces of argument within a Husserlian framework, but the bibliography itself indicates how widely Hopp has ranged over contemporary literatures in phenomenology and analytic philosophy of mind, language, and knowledge. In the course of Hopp's argumentation the reader learns by practice what phenomenology is.

By my lights, a great theme weaves its way through the course of the argument in Hopp's book: how the very structure of our experience, in perception and its role in forming our knowledge of the world, yields a form of direct realism -- arguably even where Husserlian phenomenology draws in a "transcendental" dimension that evokes some form of "transcendental idealism". The line of argument is indicated in a most helpful table of contents, featuring eleven chapter titles:

  1. Consciousness
  2. Consciousness -- A Look Inside
  3. Intentionality and Meaning
  4. The Mental Act
  5. Meaning and Intuition
  6. Perception
  7. The Essential Inadequacy of Perception
  8. The Content of Perception
  9. Knowledge
  10. Phenomenology
  11. Phenomenology and Transcendental Idealism

Hopp works in the lineage of a realist form of phenomenology developed by Dallas Willard (with whom Hopp studied at USC along with analytic philosophers of epistemology and philosophy of language). This form of phenomenology emphasizes Husserl's development of phenomenology in the Logical Investigations (1900-01). Willard was wary of Husserl's subsequent notion of "noema" in Ideas I (1913), and Hopp seems to indicate why. If the "noema" of a perceptual experience is "the perceived as perceived" (one of Husserl's characterizations), and if that is taken as an internal "image" or "appearance" representative of the external object of perception, then Husserl's hard-won realist theory of intentionality launched in the Investigations can lead into a neo-Kantian "idealism" where the actual tree one sees is "reduced" to its phenomenal appearance in one's perceptual consciousness (cf. pp. 166–169 on image-consciousness). Over the course of Hopp's book, we track detailed arguments that appraise the direct experience we have of the very real world of spatiotemporal things and people around us. For Hopp, as for Willard, Husserlian phenomenology develops fundamentally as an objective epistemology grounded in our experiences of "intuition", both sensory-perceptual intuition of natural objects and "eidetic" intuition of essences (or universals).

Following Willard, Hopp sidesteps the thorny issue of how to understand Husserl's notion of noema, resting content with the notion of intentional essence doing the work of content as distinguished from object (see pp. 252–255). The "semantic" model of intentionality via noema (as in Smith and McIntyre 1982) places the noema on what Hopp calls the left-hand side of the act-object relation (as Hopp implies on p. 254). Whereas Hopp like Willard gives up on the concept of noema, wondering "what it is" (254), the semantic model looks to a complex Husserlian ontology to detail the role of noematic sense (Sinn) in the intentional relationship (cf. Smith 2013 on the ontology). That model, I submit, strongly supports what Hopp calls "the hands-off principle" (252), by sharply distinguishing object from content along Husserlian lines. (For a recent overview of several competing interpretations of Husserlian phenomenology, see Yoshimi, Tolley, and Smith 2019.)

I'd like to explore some specific themes in Hopp's engaging study, aiming to see how a Husserlian phenomenological account of perception may yield a position of direct realism that is compatible with the "transcendental" aspect of our experience.

The transparency of consciousness?

It's fascinating that Hopp opens his contemporary introduction to phenomenology itself (in Chapter 1) with the recurrent appeal of "transparency".  Ever since G. E. Moore held that consciousness is "diaphanous", others have intoned the appeal of the thesis that consciousness is "transparent". When I see the red in a passing sportscar, so the view claims, I am conscious of the red (the object of my awareness) but in no way conscious of my consciousness of the red (the experience itself). Moving beyond sense data, the thesis holds that when I see that speeding red Porsche, I am conscious of the speeding sportscar (the external object) but in no way conscious of my seeing the car (the subjective experience itself).

The transparency thesis, then, denies that we have any form of awareness of consciousness per se, beyond the objects of which we are aware. In detailed argumentation (10–16), Hopp argues that the transparency thesis is false. Grant that it is "impossible to specify the phenomenal character of an intentional experience without specifying its object" (16). Nonetheless, there is something in the phenomenal experience that opens the door to phenomenological reflection on that experience. Hopp zeroes in on the "intuitive" character of perception, the "fulness" absent in merely thinking of an object (say, thinking of a speeding red Porsche without seeing such). There is something more in perceptual consciousness, then, than its experienced object. Throughout the book Hopp emphasizes the importance of "intuition" and its role in supporting knowledge. That there is in an intentional experience some form of awareness of the intentional awareness is, I take it, a condition both of experience and therewith of the practice of phenomenology. Moreover, in Hopp's account, phenomenology fundamentally leads to a theory of our knowledge founded in our "intuitive" experience. Accordingly, Hopp unfolds a careful study of Husserl's "principle of all principles" (217ff.), which holds, as Hopp quotes Husserl, citing Ideas I, §141: "the original source of all legitimacy [in positings about the world] lies in the immediate evidence for them, . . . in the originary evidence or in the originary givenness motivating those positings" (219).

The transparency thesis might play a role in motivating "disjunctivist" views of perception. But Hopp argues for a Husserlian theory of perception, clearly distinguishing internal content from external object, partly by critiquing recent "disjunctivist" views (cf. pp. 194ff.). Hopp persuasively makes the phenomenological case for the role of "internal" content in both veridical perception and hallucination -- disjunctivists having held that there is nothing in common between these forms of experience, even dismissing content altogether from veridical perception but allowing content in hallucination.

What we see in Hopp's critique of transparency is a spotlight on our "originary" perceptual evidence of the world, as we are directly "given" things in perception. In this givenness lies the "source" (Hopp's emphasis) of both our knowledge of the world and our practice of phenomenology. Here lies a fundamental realism in the "origin" of our knowledge and simultaneously our phenomenological analysis of our everyday knowledge.

The "horizon" of an object given in perception?

As Hopp observes, "Husserl characterizes perceptual experiences as consisting of intuitive content and a horizon. The concept of the horizon is one of the most important in phenomenology" (139). Indeed, and Hopp draws on the notion of horizon to explicate how perception is a "direct" experience of an object even though "inadequate". (See pp. 138–150 on "horizon", 166ff. on "profiles", and pp. 148–150 on why perception is "direct".)

When I see a car before me, I am visually given not merely, say, "that speeding red Porsche", but an object I could see from different sides, expecting that its other side is red like the side facing me and is similar in shape to this side, and that if it were parked and I took the driver's seat I would find a gear shift on the center console. This "horizon" of motivated further possibilities regarding what I am directly given is an integral part of the content of my visual experience. Specifically, various "profiles" -- or "adumbrations" (Abschattungen) -- of the shape and color of the far side of the car I see, and further adumbrations of its interior, are motivated possibilities "predelineated" in the horizon of my experience. Such profiles figure in Hopp's line of argument for how perception, though "inadequate", affords a direct "originary" intentional relation to the world. On this Husserlian analysis, the manifold of profiles given in the horizon of our seeing an object delineates our potential "evidence" of its very existence. Horizon opens the door, then, to a basic realism implicit in the content of everyday perception. (See Chapters 5–8 for Hopp's many arguments in detail, and pp. 166ff. on "profiles". Cf. Smith 2020 and 2021 on the complex details of Husserl's theory of "constitution" via noema, horizon, and adumbrations.)

The realism amidst transcendental idealism?

In Chapter 10 Hopp finally gathers together an overarching picture of Husserlian phenomenology, drawing into his conception of the discipline Husserl's proposed "transcendental" method of "phenomenological reduction" via "epoché".  In Chapter 11 Hopp then addresses the problem of "transcendental idealism": what to make of a realist Husserlian take on "transcendental idealism". Skepticism is out of bounds for Hopp (cf. pp. 210ff.). Still, adapting Husserl's own results, Hopp argues, we may accommodate the "transcendental" side of Husserlian phenomenology. But the fit is not comfortable.

In his review of Hopp's book, Jeff Yoshimi (2021) draws a distinction between "two modes of phenomenological analysis":

First order phenomenology corresponds to the phenomenology of the natural attitude, prior to carrying out the reduction. From this standpoint we have acts, and separately we have objects, and we can use Hopp's system to describe the intentional logic of their relationships. Second order phenomenology [by contrast] corresponds to the phenomenological attitude.  

At issue is the phenomenology of phenomenological reflection itself. Staying within the "natural attitude" we can develop a Husserlian phenomenology just as Hopp does. But in adopting the "phenomenological attitude", as Husserl is standardly read, we "bracket" the question of the existence of the very world in which we analyze the act-content-object structure of our own phenomenal intentional experience. Despite largely agreeing with Hopp's realist conception of phenomenology, Yoshimi poses a 21st century problem for how a realist phenomenology might accommodate phenomenological reduction -- with Yoshimi writing as a proponent of neurophenomenology (Yoshimi 2015). (Cf. Hopp, pp. 128–129, 180–200, and 274–293, on varieties of realism vis-à-vis transcendental phenomenology.)

Consider, Yoshimi offers, an expanded Matrix thought experiment, on which I'll riff and embellish a bit here. Scientists at Neuralink labs have developed a system to record and reproduce neuron-by-neuron the full pattern of neural activity in my brain during a range of real-world experience. During my morning walk all my neural activity is recorded. Now I visit the lab and, sitting in the subject's chair, I experience the Neuralink recording of my actual morning walk, projected into my brain. Sitting in the lab chair, I now experience a stream of consciousness indistinguishable in phenomenological character and structure from that of my experience in actually walking along and craning my neck to see yonder Heron. Being a member of the research team, I am fully aware that in reality I am sitting in the chair with the Neuralink system creating the neural substrate of my current stream of experience as if I am walking and gazing at the Heron.

We continue. I am a practicing transcendental phenomenologist working with the neuroscience team at Neuralink. On my morning walk the next day, as I walk along and crane my neck to see the Heron, I shift into the transcendental phenomenological attitude. I now experience my walking along and craning my neck to see the Heron, but I withhold my natural judgment that all this is occurring in the actual world (wherein I well know that my stream of experience is produced by the pattern of neural activity transpiring in my brain as I experience my walking and Heron-gazing). Notice that we are beyond "transparent" experience: I am aware in two different ways of my passing experiences, the first in the natural attitude (actually walking and Heron-gazing) and the second in the phenomenological attitude (quite as if sitting in my Neuralink chair). Also note that, true to perceptual experience, my Neuralink virtual experience presents the virtual Heron with a horizon of profiles.

The neo-Matrix thought experiment brings the venerable Cartesian conceit into the 21st century: where we would reconcile today's neuroscience of our consciousness with today's understanding of Husserlian methodology. In Yoshimi's appraisal, the Neuralink phenomenologist may speak of virtual-reality entities called "act", "content", and "object", but these are not the act, content, and object of the intentional relationship in the real world (whatever their ontology may be). Similarly, one may argue, as I take my morning walk and adopt the phenomenological attitude as I walk and Heron-gaze, I may speak of noematic entities called "act", "content", and "object". But these noematic entities -- appearing only in phenomenological reflection -- are not the act, content, and object ensconced in the real-world intentional relationship I enjoy in walking and seeing the Heron. When as phenomenologist I sit again in the Neuralink chair and virtually experience my walking and Heron-gazing, I will take the virtual entities appearing in my Neuralink stream of experience as in fact the noematic entities I observed in transcendental phenomenology (whatever their ontology may be). Notice that, on this account, the noematic items include not only "object", but also "act" and "content" and "intentional relationship": all taken just as given in reflection. Thus, the reflective part of my experience in walking and Heron-gazing with a phenomenological attitude is a second-order, meta-experiential component in my overall experience: I am in part focused on my experience even as I am living it.

Hopp, Yoshimi, and I should all agree that the virtual or noematic entities I observe are not "images" that stand in like digital screen avatars for elements of my real experience of walking and Heron-gazing. The neo-Matrix scenario reminds us how the form of phenomenal intentional experience is abstracted and reproduced by controlling the subject's neural processing. Accordingly, we should see, the phenomenologically reduced "act"-"content"-"object" entities are contents abstracted from the real-world intentional relationship. For the noetic elements bearing these noematic contents are already a part of the real-world relationship. Have we thus brought together real-world experience and its "pure" or "reduced" phenomenological structure?

The phenomenological "reduction" was a work in progress for Husserl himself. In his Crisis (posthumous 1935–38 writings), Husserl distinguished different stages of "bracketing", distinguishing relevant structures in the everyday life-world, in the mathematized spatiotemporal world of mathematical physics, and in the world of "pure" consciousness. More significant to the neo-Matrix thought experiment is Husserl's occasional talk of a "zig-zag" methodology in which we move back and forth between different domains of experience or knowledge. This is where we are today, moving back and forth between phenomenal experience and its neural basis.

In today's world we cannot, realistically, "bracket" our emerging understanding of how neuroscience shows that our lived subjective consciousness is grounded in the intricacies of neural activity in our human bodies. What we can do is carefully distinguish the phenomenal properties of our conscious experiences per se from the properties of their implementation or execution or grounding in our neural processes. This type of distinction is what Husserl's practice of "reduction" is all about! But Husserl's methodology of reduction was and remains a work in progress. The neo-Matrix thought experiment continues the challenge: how to abstract and articulate the "pure" phenomenological structures we experience in everyday consciousness that we today know is grounded in coordinate neural activity.

Hopp's book is a terrific study, full of intriguing arguments within a broadly Husserlian approach to phenomenology. I applaud his critical approach to the problems of perception, knowledge, and reality: as Husserl's own results beckon us to extend phenomenology in a context of philosophizing today -- quite as in the spirit of this more than introductory study in phenomenology.[1]


Hopp, Walter. 2020. Phenomenology: A Contemporary Introduction. New York and London: Routledge. All references in the present review are to this edition.

Smith, David Woodruff. 2013. Husserl. In the Routledge Philosophers series. 2nd ed. London and New York: Routledge.

Smith, David Woodruff. 2020. "Phenomenology as Constitutive Realism". In Metametaphysics and the Sciences: Historical and Philosophical Perspectives. Frode Kjosavik and Camilla Serck-Hanssen (eds.). London and New York: Routledge, 2020. 168–199.

Smith, David Woodruff. forthcoming. "Structures of Inner Consciousness: Brentano Onward". Inquiry.

Smith, David Woodruff, and McIntyre, Ronald. 1982. Husserl and Intentionality: A Study of Mind, Meaning, and Language. Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company, now Springer.

Yoshimi, Jeff. 2015. Husserlian Phenomenology: A Unifying Interpretation. Boston and Dordrecht: Springer.

Yoshimi, Jeff. 2021. "Two Conceptions of Husserlian Phenomenology: A Review of Walter Hopp's Phenomenology: A Contemporary Introduction". Husserl Studies. Published online: 31 May 2021. 1–9.

Yoshimi, J., Tolley, C., and Smith, D. W. 2019. "California Phenomenology". In The Reception of Husserlian Phenomenology in North America. Dordrecht and Boston: Springer, 2019. 365–387.


[1] Until the neo-Matrix thought experiment, I have tried above to bracket those ranges of theory which would extend a Husserlian phenomenology beyond Hopp's well-argued conception. The semantic model of intentionality is detailed in Smith 2013, following on Smith and McIntyre 1982. The dynamical systems model of intentionality is detailed in Yoshimi 2015. Details of a constitutive realism are explored in Smith 2020 and 2021.