Phenomenology and Embodiment: Husserl and the Constitution of Subjectivity

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Joona Taipale, Phenomenology and Embodiment: Husserl and the Constitution of Subjectivity, Northwestern University Press, 2014, 243pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810129504.

Reviewed by Lanei M. Rodemeyer, Duquesne University


Joona Taipale offers a remarkably thorough analysis of the constitutive importance of the lived-body for phenomenology. Beginning at the most basic level of sensation, Taipale builds his investigation, moving from self-awareness and subjectivity, through intersubjectivity, and finally to generativity and historicity. In doing so, he argues that embodiment is an essential component to each of these phenomenological levels. Along the way, his examination also yields useful distinctions with regard to specific key terminology.

In Part 1, "Selfhood and the Lived-Body", Taipale works through the fundamentals of his argument: Taking "self-awareness" in an immediate and material sense, he explains how sensation -- understood broadly as underlying all experience and conscious (noetic) activity -- enables our self-awareness prior to any reflective activity. This self-awareness thus makes reflection possible. Taipale develops this understanding through an analysis of both hyletic (material content) and kinesthetic (movement) sensations, ultimately arguing that these sensations are at the root of subjectivity itself. Moving then from sensation to the constitution of the lived-body, Taipale offers a productive analysis of the "double-sensation" of the body, demonstrating that this double-sensation -- the manner in which the body can sense itself both "internally" and "externally" when it touches itself -- is crucial to the very constitution of the lived-body itself:

The possibility of "double sensations" is not a mere phenomenological curiosity void of constitutive significance, but a phenomenon that has an important role in the constitution of the lived-body, and hence in the localization of subjectivity. . . . In other words, through double sensation we experience the peculiar articulation of internal and external, and understand that the field of sensing and the pre-objective lived-body are one and the same. (51)

The importance of double-sensation provides grounds for arguing the priority of the tactile sensation over the other sense-fields (along with Husserl in his investigations of the body), and, as seen just above, to address how the lived-body can sense itself as both subjective and objective, albeit in a limited way. Taipale concludes with a helpful clarification of three major levels of selfhood: First, "agency" is the active sense of willing specific movements and actions; second, habituality is a "passively active" sense of acting, where we carry out motions without thinking about them, usually developed as habits (habits that we could change if we wished, but currently execute without actively deciding to do so); third, ipseity is a "passive and minimal form of selfhood" (57). With this terminology in hand, Taipale is then able to work through the constitution of the lived-body as one that does not stop at the skin, but rather has quasi-extension through the objects and habits that it has incorporated into its ways of being.

Accordingly, incorporation designates the extension of the embodied self in the minimal and habitual sense, but not in the active sense. On the other hand, explicit activity . . . is embedded in habituality . . . and in this sense the active self also becomes expanded through incorporation. (63)

The lived-body, then, is a dynamic notion that depends upon our relation with the environment, and which, further, is experienced as both the body that we "have" and the body that we "are".

Having established the body as the essential foundation for subjectivity (through sensation, and especially tactile sensation), Taipale then transitions to an analysis of "Intersubjectivity" in his Part 2. Here the lived-body shifts somewhat to the background of Taipale's analyses, as he focuses on the relation -- and necessary tension -- between subjectivity and intersubjectivity. In his examination, Taipale identifies three levels of intersubjectivity. First, "a priori intersubjectivity" is the anonymous level of intersubjectivity implicit in our experience of the objective world. This is not an experience of specific others in my presence, nor is it a reference to others in any explicit sense (even when absent). Rather, this is a passive sense of intersubjectivity implied at the intentional level of perceiving objects, a passive sense of an object's "being there for anyone" (73). This implication of anonymous co-perceivers is necessary to perception, because objects are given as unitary things with a multitude of perspectives precisely because those perspectives are there for "anyone". Thus, for Taipale, the body is necessary already to our most fundamental experience of intersubjectivity, since a priori intersubjectivity arises through perception, which itself is a function of the lived-body.

The second level of intersubjectivity is the more familiar phenomenological level of empathy, or "social intersubjectivity". Taipale takes a two-pronged approach in arguing the importance of embodiment to this level of intersubjective awareness. The first is a developmental approach, following Merleau-Ponty's analyses of child development. Here Taipale works through the concrete formation of subjectivity and intersubjectivity for the infant through basic and embodied senses of difference. My awareness of other subjects, he argues, develops along with the development of my sense of the lived-body as my own. Then, in order to address how the bodies of other subjects appear as lived-bodies rather than as objects, Taipale analyzes Husserl's explication of empathy, where the concrete appearance of the other is the launching point for Husserl's analysis. In doing so, Taipale applies his earlier discussions of the lived-body to Husserl's notion of "pairing", showing how the resonance between my body and that of another subject is a passive connection that implies both of our lived-bodies as spontaneously active beings. Both levels of intersubjectivity -- a priori and social -- Taipale then claims, are grounded in embodiment. A priori intersubjectivity requires the activity of perception, which is itself an embodied affair, and social intersubjectivity is grounded in the concrete appearance of the other, both developmentally and phenomenologically.

Furthermore, a priori intersubjectivity is the transcendental ground for our concrete, social experience of others. The actual appearance of another person is therefore an exemplar, the fulfillment of the anonymous, a priori structure: "In this way, actual others, so to speak, come to fill in the slot that was a priori prepared for them by perception itself." (84) In fact, Taipale argues that the a priori structure of intersubjectivity comes before the experience of concrete others: "Already before we perceive others, our perceptual consciousness is characterized by an a priori intersubjectivity." (86) However, while this conclusion seems phenomenologically accurate -- that a transcendental intersubjective openness underlies the concrete experience of others as other subjects -- it is not clear that it is developmentally so, since a priori intersubjectivity requires the perception of objects as unities, which occurs only after a certain amount of child development. Given the analyses of child development to which Taipale refers, it appears that the concrete awareness of other subjects (social intersubjectivity) probably goes hand-in-hand with the awareness of objects as unities (a priori intersubjectivity) -- if the concrete awareness of others is not first -- since Merleau-Ponty's insight is that infants seem to gain both intersubjective and objective awareness along with the development of their own bodies. Thus, developmentally, infants probably perceive objective entities around the same time as, or even through (and thus following), the actual appearance of other subjects. Nevertheless, this small point does not negate Taipale's overall argument, that embodiment is essential to both of these dimensions of intersubjectivity, through the perception of objects and of other subjects.

Taipale then concludes his discussion of social intersubjectivity with an analysis of intersubjective habituation. In other words, similar to our incorporation of objects in our environment, which can be studied on the individual level, intersubjectivity is also incorporated into the subject. In fact, intersubjectivity is interwoven with the subject in more than one way: not only do we passively retain the a priori experience of intersubjectivity in individual consciousness, but we also take on the habits and accepted behaviors of our social surroundings, living them as our own. This leads to a "tension" to which Taipale will also refer later, between primordial experience (my own sensory and lived-bodily experiences) and intersubjective norms.

The third level of intersubjectivity, that of "historicity and generativity", arises out of this last point. Taipale introduces Husserl's notion of "homeworld" as a way to discuss our integration with language and social meanings, as well as our distinction between our own, familiar culture and other, less familiar cultures. This generative level of intersubjectivity is based on the social level, which, as discussed above, is based on the a priori level. Each level implies the involvement of embodiment, the generative relying not only on the concrete existence of my intersubjective culture, but also on the historical importance of my ancestors and descendants to my own self-constitution. Once again, Taipale acknowledges the "paradox" in our self-constitution, between the genetic and the generative, or more simply, between my own experience and the constitutive influences of the language and culture in which I am embedded.

In Part 3, "Primordial and Intersubjective Normality", Taipale addresses this "tension" or "paradox" more directly. Working through notions such as "normal" and "optimal" as well as the constitution of "nature", he concludes that neither primordial nor intersubjective normality is collapsible into the other. Rather, they maintain a dynamic yet essential tension, where my primordial (embodied) experience is the basis for all levels of intersubjectivity and, at the same time, intersubjectivity is essential to many aspects of my self-constitution and, further, to my very activity of perception. In fact, he argues, even what is experienced as "objective nature" is a normative notion based upon intersubjective perception and social presumptions. "Hence what we simply took as shared objectivity turns out to be objectivity-for-us, objectivity shared within a particular intersubjective community." (145)

Given this conclusion, Taipale's final analysis (after a brief, somewhat unnecessary, segue into our relations with animals), offers another sense of "objectivity", but under a different name: "earth-ground". This is the aspect of the world that relativizes my own lived-bodily orientation, determining that according to which I orient myself: "That is, in the constitution of space, the ground is given as an absolute point of reference: even our lived-body, the primordial zero-point of orientation, is oriented in relation to the ground." (158) Taipale introduces the notions of "vertical" as applicable to the ground, and "horizontal" to the lived-body, as a way to work through their relation. However, the notion of ground becomes somewhat confused in his explication. On the one hand, it is comparable to intersubjectivity: "The claim that horizontal orientation is ultimately established in reference to vertical orientation does not mean that the intersubjective norm (the ground) would overrule or replace the primordial norm (our lived-body)." (158-59) On the other hand, the ground appears to have a relation to the body distinct from intersubjectivity: "This is because the ground is given affectively: it reveals itself in the weight of our body." (158) In fact, the ground is given as "an absolute point of reference", as cited above -- but the lived-body itself, which Taipale assesses, is also both absolute and relative: "Hence, as both intersubjectivity and primordiality are present in the constitution of space, we must maintain that the lived-body is, paradoxically, both absolute and relative." (160).

It thus becomes unclear whether Taipale's discussion of "ground" is meant to reveal the latter insight about the lived-body, i.e., its paradoxical being as both absolute and relative, or is intended to bring a third component into his consideration of the relation between subjectivity and intersubjectivity: "On the one hand, the ground is revealed within bodily experiences and is thus relative to the latter, whereas on the other hand, bodily experience is intersubjectively oriented in regard to the ground, and is thus relative to the former." (160) It seems clear that the notion of "ground" for Husserl is an extremely productive one, but at the same time, it would require another extensive analysis (i.e., another book) to work through the different ways in which Husserl employs the term and the ways that the experience of "ground" manifests itself. Since Taipale moves on to work through how both subjectivity and intersubjectivity are each absolute and relative -- a difficult and yet phenomenologically sound assessment of the different levels of experience -- his discussion of "ground" would probably have been better left unearthed, as it were.

Overall, though, Taipale's approach to the constitutive importance of the lived-body at each major phenomenological level, i.e., subjectivity, intersubjectivity, and historicity/generativity, is a rigorous analysis, both textually and phenomenologically. He offers multiple useful distinctions and insights, and his argument that the lived-body is phenomenologically essential to constitution on any level is well developed and substantiated.