Phenomenology and Imagination in Husserl and Heidegger

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Brian Elliott, Phenomenology and Imagination in Husserl and Heidegger, Routledge, 2005, 183pp., $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415324033.

Reviewed by Julia Jansen, University College Cork


With Phenomenology and Imagination in Husserl and Heidegger Elliott puts forward a compact and accessible book that helps us understand the important relation between the two most central thinkers of the phenomenological tradition. Without getting entangled in either terminology and without demanding extensive familiarity with either paradigm, Elliott presents the main tenets of both philosophies and the respective views on imagination. His comparison is led by an important philosophical hypothesis, namely that the issue of imagination, more specifically Kant's theory of imagination, is an especially well-suited tertium comparationis. This hypothesis is confirmed by the insightful and lucid account that ensues from it. Even for those who might not agree with Elliott's interpretations in general or in detail, this book provides a highly interesting view on both Husserl and Heidegger. Above all, it demonstrates the vital relevance of imagination for philosophy.

What Elliott is after is the very 'sense of phenomenology' (1). The issue of imagination provides the focus by which he traces this sense from its inception in Husserl to its eventual 'destruction' (Abbau) in Heidegger. This exposes what Elliott calls its 'pre-sense', that is, the very structures and articulations of human existence it is meant to reveal. Accordingly, the book has two parts, the first of which is devoted to Husserl's development of the 'sense of phenomenology'. The second deals with Heidegger's disclosure of the 'pre-sense' of phenomenology. Ultimately, however, Elliott shows how Heidegger's 'turn' is also a turn away from imagination as a central feature of human existence. This, Elliott argues, also marks Heidegger's departure from phenomenology. If phenomenology is continued beyond Husserl and Heidegger, this will be with a transformed notion of 'heterotopic' imagination, which captures the historical and communal sense of experience. Thus runs the intriguing and challenging conclusion of this study.

Elliott sets up the problem of imagination within the context of Husserl's earliest writings on expression and intuition. Husserl's break from Kant's philosophy by way of an extension of the notion of intuition is crucial here. With the concept of 'categorial intuition' Husserl means to undo the divide between the sensible and the rational. But with this gap gone, the notion of a transcendental imagination, which in Kant's system is required to bridge it, seems to have lost its purpose. Dismissing any hypostasization of acts into faculties and rejecting the view that rational order is a high-level superimposition on low-level sensible experience, Husserl thus transforms his 'critique' into a "description of how 'logical' structure is adumbrated and predelineated at the most basic level of conscious life". (7) The understanding/sensibility-divide is thereby converted into an "intention/fulfilment dynamic", in which "any act of intuition is the fulfilment of an intention that necessarily precedes it as an 'empty intending' of the object meant." (8)

While this view seems to render imagination superfluous, Elliott opposes it and instead emphasises its "pivotal role" in Husserlian phenomenology. (8) Husserl makes explicit only the important methodological role the imagination plays for phenomenology. But his statements sit uneasily within his early considerations of the intention/intuition-dynamic. Elliott reminds us of the fact that Husserl's interest in imagination was, at least initially, motivated by his interest in mathematical and conceptual objects, which demand an explanation of how we can intend something that has no empirical reality. This leads Husserl to an account that implies an

'indifference' of meaningful acts of presentation to the concrete existence or reality of what such acts mean or aim at: the 'sense of being' for consciousness is not essentially that of empirical reality. (20)

In this sense, Elliott convinces that "Husserl's own articulation of phenomenological thought points in itself to the centrality of the imagination." (23) This receives further confirmation when he leads us through the relevant sections of the Logical Investigations for a further assessment of the explicit methodological relevance of imagination. The key aspect of its relevance lies in the parallelism between perception and imagination, which allows for a considerable expansion of the scope of phenomenological analyses. It means that phenomenologists do not have to rely on their perceptions for their reflections. As Husserl says, 'any inner fantasy, constructing in the freest of fictional modes, would serve just as well, provided it possesses sufficient intuitive clarity: indeed it serves preferably'. The thus asserted primacy of the imaginary over the perceptual stems from two characteristic features of the imagination: When we imagine we expand our field of intuition from what is actual to everything which is possible and we can move freely in the sense that we are not dependent on what happens to present itself to us perceptually. Imagination is thereby marked as both the domain of possibility and the realm of freedom (cf. 35).

However, while Husserl acknowledges the 'primacy of the imagination', he also restricts it to these methodological applications and continues to speak of intuition when evidence and insight are concerned. It is this restriction that Elliott takes issue with. In opposition to Husserl's express views, he wants "to show that what Husserl identifies as the work of categorial acts points back to the more basic 'achievement' of imagination in opening the very field of 'general intuition'" (39).

To this purpose Elliott extends his investigation to Husserl's views on time-consciousness. He acknowledges Husserl's critique of Brentano who had given imagination (in its moments of memory and anticipation) a central function in the emergence of time-consciousness. As Elliott proceeds to explain, Husserl maintains that phenomenological evidence contradicts Brentano's doctrine. Consciousness of a continuing present is not constructed out of now-points, accompanied by memory and anticipation. Rather, the present stretches from an originary, or primal impression (Urimpression) over retention and protention, i.e., the present which is 'just passed' and the present which is 'not yet'. Thus, in Husserl's view, time consciousness is in an important sense not imaginative. The present 'now' is perceived, although it is always already mediated through retention and protention.

However, Elliott attempts to qualify Husserl's stance by highlighting the importance Husserl attributes to remembrance for phenomenological reflections on time. And in a second step, he questions Husserl's distinction between remembrance and imagination on the grounds that there are cases in which the distinguishing criterion of positionality fails to work. There are cases in which we remember something without positing it (as something that was) and cases in which we imagine something positing it (as something that was) although we cannot ascribe it to ourselves and hence do not experience it as a remembrance. Here Elliott pushes Husserl's account into an interesting direction. He takes this break-down as an indication "that a space is left open for a phenomenological elucidation of time-consciousness by means of imaginative presentation." (46)

This gives Elliott a lever to use in an attempt to break open Husserl's system. The basic contention is a variation of Derrida's charge of a 'metaphysics of presence'. Elliott's objection to Husserl's phenomenological enterprise in general is that Husserl is so concerned with offering an account for the unity and coherency of experience that he illegitimately suppresses evidence of dissonance and difference. With regards to Husserl's notion of imagination in particular, this results in a 'taming' of what can be a rather 'wild' mode of consciousness (these are not Elliott's words) whose disruptive function has been carefully observed by Ricoeur, Derrida, and others. And whether Elliott is ultimately able to crack Husserl's system or not, this undoubtedly is a, maybe even the, major shortcoming of Husserl's account of imagination. It is not so much that his account is inconsistent or that his descriptions are implausible. It is that he seems to leave out a whole range of phenomena that also belong to imagination, such as issues of aesthetic experience and of creativity more generally.

In this sense, Elliott is justified in claiming that Husserl displays the same exaggerated caution that Heidegger had ascribed to Kant, who, in Heidegger's famous opinion, had 'shrunk back' from imagination. His assessment that Husserl is more interested in unity than in divergence, more in identity than in difference and is therefore led to ignore imagination's potential for inserting difference and dissonance, is probably right, regardless of whether one finds the primacy of identity philosophically illegitimate or justified by phenomenological evidence.

Further, in Elliott's view, Husserl does not only ignore an entire dimension of the phenomenology of imagination (namely the dimension of the capricious and the dissonant) but he also fails to realize the full reach of his own observations for his general account of consciousness. Because "phenomenology is merely an operation of making explicit the pre-phenomenological dynamic of consciousness itself" (60; original emphasis), the relevance of imagination cannot be merely methodological. It stems from a "basic dynamic of consciousness" (59) that enables us, in general, to intend the possible and to gain independence from the actual. This is vital for all kinds of human activities, not only eidetics or phenomenology. "The way to theory for conscious life both in general and in the particular case of phenomenology is principally by way of imagination." (59)

However, while the important role that our ability to imagine possibilities has for our conscious life in general is obvious, Elliott's conclusion that therefore the most basic structure of consciousness must itself be imaginative does not follow. I therefore fail to see the fundamental tension that Elliott identifies in Husserl's overall position on imagination. Elliott claims that the

thoroughgoing equivocation with respect to the fundamental status of time for conscious life is a crucial index of the principal unresolved dualism at the heart of Husserl's sense of phenomenology. (61)
In other words, on the one hand, Husserl sees all appearances as exemplifications of recurring extra-temporal essences; on the other hand, he claims that all appearances are given to temporalizing consciousness 'originally' and as temporal. (cf. 61) Thus, he oscillates between asserting the primacy of the ideal and proclaiming the primacy of the real. Moreover, "as Husserl's analysis of conscious life is in all respects directed in advance by an idea of synthetic unity" (61) he continues to be engaged in the attempt to bridge this gap -- an attempt at which, according to Elliott, he ultimately fails.

But Elliott might be overstating the case by construing Husserl's intention/fulfilment relation as "an a priori pre-figuration" that "would lend to any concrete perception the quality of quasi-remembrance". He also interprets Husserl's notion of 'originary impression' (against Husserl's own view) as "a source point for all consciousness without necessary synthetic connection to other moments in the flow of consciousness" (62). However, a different reading than Elliott's is possible (and more coherent with Husserl's view). This reading does juxtapose a priori pre-figuration and purely impressional consciousness. But it understands Husserl as trying to capture both the sense in which the world appears to us as regulated (in ways which we can become aware of but which we experience as essential and independent from us) and the sense in which we experience an ongoing encounter with the appearing world (an encounter which we do not control but to which we are exposed). On this reading it might be part of our feeling 'exposed' that we are unable to grasp the moment of encounter -- hence Husserl's insistence that "the now is precisely only an ideal limit, something abstract, which can be nothing by itself … but is continuously mediated" (PCIT, ยง16).

The notion of an "imaginative synthesis at the heart of primitive sensible givenness" (63) runs counter to both of these senses, unless one is -- like Kant but unlike Husserl -- interested in an explanation instead of a description of consciousness. Indeed if one wants to explain how perceptions can, in general, be compatible with concepts, then it makes sense to think of a synthetic process that renders intelligible perceptions from sensations. Depending on one's notion of imagination, it might make sense to attribute this synthesis to imagination. Within the Husserlian project, however, to "identify the imagination as the ultimate origin of conscious life itself" (63) would mean to 'irrealise' experience and to give up the distinction between the actual and the possible. This would be to ignore both senses in which we precisely do not feel free in our experiences of the world and in which we do not experience ourselves as authors of our own experiences.

That said, Elliott does not aim at historical reconstruction but at a "productive transformation of Husserlian phenomenology" (79). And it is worthwhile following his argument regardless of possible disagreements with his presentation of either Husserl or Heidegger. There is a sense in which Heidegger seems, however, treated more 'fairly' by Elliott while Husserl is largely understood from a broadly Heideggerean perspective. This is, of course, consistent with Elliott's belief that it is Heidegger who first comes close to a radical notion of imagination as producing the basic temporal horizon of human understanding and to a "hermeneutical transformation of the phenomenological project [at which] the imaginative apprehension both of difference and radical singularity takes centre stage" (80).

In chapters 5-7 of this book, Elliott then carefully excavates the developing notion of imagination from Heidegger's hermeneutical critique of Husserl, from his appropriation of Kant's notion of productive imagination around the themes of temporality and finitude, towards a strong notion of 'ante-human' freedom and transcendence. In the end, however, as Elliott convincingly shows, this trajectory collapses under the weight of Heidegger's turn which brings to a halt his earlier attempts to place imagination at the centre of phenomenology. Instead, Heidegger removes historical truth from the sphere of human freedom and replaces it with myth; that is, he substitutes the transcendental-aesthetic with a mythical-poetic figure of imagination. In Elliott's words, this

move is understood here as marking an abandonment of phenomenology in any meaningful sense, that is, it constitutes the 'ab-sence' of phenomenology within Heidegger's thought. (141)
At the same time, however, this 'ab-sence' brings forth a new phenomenology that seeks dialogue not with science but with art.

Elliott ends his book with a critical chapter that makes explicit both the political dangers and the philosophical potential of this move. On the one hand, it enables Heidegger to make an attempt to "relegitimize the 'transcendent'" by which "all claims of philosophy become subject to an ultimately opaque mediation" and philosophy "necessarily finds itself on the wrong side of the line that divides what Kant distinguished as enthusiasm and fanaticism" (150). On the other hand, it opens up "an unrealised future possibility of phenomenological thinking" (ibid.), a "phenomenology as aesthetics" (154). This future phenomenology will have to negotiate the very risks that Heidegger's case makes so obvious. Elliott indicates that this aesthetics

would have to be 'archaeological' in Foucault's sense of being directed towards the historical dimension of experience as discontinuity and rupture rather than continuity and integration. (154)
Presumably, this will also require a new transformation of imagination, which would have to capture the communal and situated aspects of human existence. It will be exciting to see how this future will emerge.