Phenomenology and Naturalism: Examining the Relationship between Human Experience and Nature

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Havi Carel and Darian Meacham (eds.), Phenomenology and Naturalism: Examining the Relationship between Human Experience and Nature, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 341pp. $39.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781107699052.

Reviewed by Evan Thompson, University of British Columbia


This somewhat disparate collection concerns the difficult relationship between phenomenology and naturalism. Although the editors state in their introduction that "phenomenology," as understood in the volume, refers to the style and method of doing philosophy that originated with Edmund Husserl and was carried forward in different ways by Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, three of the fourteen essays (by James Lenman, Alison Assiter, and Iain Hamilton Grant, respectively) make little or no mention of phenomenology defined in this way, though they do concern various ontological and ethical issues about the relationship between human experience and the natural world. "Naturalism," too, is understood in a variety of ways. Given the heterogeneity of the essays, it will not be possible to discuss them all here. Instead, my focus will be on those essays that examine the relationship between naturalism and phenomenology in its broadly Husserlian and Heideggerian senses.

It will be useful to have in hand a forceful form of naturalism. "Scientific naturalism" can be defined as the view that science provides the best account of reality. The view has an ontological component and a methodological component (Papineau 2009). The ontological component is physicalism, the thesis that everything that exists, including the mind, is completely physical. The methodological component is the thesis that the methods of empirical science give science a general and final authority about the world, and therefore science should be epistemically privileged over all other forms of investigation. Scientific naturalism is a philosophical thesis, not a thesis belonging to any of the empirical sciences themselves. Although some scientists may espouse scientific naturalism, it is not built into the actual practice of empirical science. Moreover, when a scientist gives voice to scientific naturalism, she or he no longer speaks just as a scientist. Dan Zahavi quotes Husserl to make this point:

When it is actually natural science that speaks, we listen gladly and as disciples. But it is not always natural science that speaks when natural scientists are speaking; and it assuredly is not when they are talking about 'philosophy of Nature' and 'epistemology as a natural science.' (Husserl 1982, p. 39, quoted by Zahavi, p. 31).

Phenomenology, understood as transcendental philosophy (Husserl, Merleau-Ponty), fundamental ontology (Heidegger), or existential analysis (Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty), stands opposed to scientific naturalism, especially its methodological component. Phenomenologists generally argue that naturalism overlooks and cannot account for the necessary conditions of its own possibility. For example, as Zahavi and Dermot Moran explain, Husserl argues that naturalistic treatments of consciousness as a biological or psychological property of certain organisms overlook and cannot account for the transcendental standing of consciousness as a necessary condition of possibility for any entity to appear in whatever way it does and with whatever meaning it has. Husserl (1970) also argues that scientific naturalism presupposes and overlooks the "life-world" as a transcendental structure of intersubjective understanding, without which science would not be possible. Moran explains the phenomenological concept of the life-world as Husserl presented it. The concept also plays a significant role in Matthew Ratcliffe's contribution, which argues in an original way that the intelligibility of science presupposes the life-world, yet scientific naturalism remains oblivious to the life-world's existential and epistemological primacy.

Another way to sharpen the issue between phenomenology and naturalism is to draw on Heidegger's concept of "world" (Heidegger 1962). By "world" Heidegger means neither the totality of things or states of affairs nor the being of that totality as nature, but the everyday world as the place in which we find ourselves and as an existential structure of our being (Being in Time, Part One: II-III). We exist as "being-in-the-world," which means, among other things, that we always find ourselves inhabiting a "space of meaning" (Crowell 2001) that we ourselves create. When we think scientifically of the universe or nature as containing our world, we are not thinking of the world in the proper philosophical sense as the space of meaning in which anything is intelligible. When we think of the world in this philosophical way, however, then we have to reverse the formulation and say that the universe or nature is within the world (Heidegger 1982, p. 165), for it is always within the world that the universe or nature is disclosed to us. In this way, the world as the space of meaning has priority in the order of philosophical inquiry and understanding over the universe as represented by empirical science. As Havi Carel and Darian Meacham state in their "Editors' Introduction," "whereas naturalism takes objectivity as its point of departure, phenomenology asks how objectivity is constituted in the first place" (p. 3).

We can now state the objection that phenomenology makes to the methodological component of scientific naturalism. Phenomenology charges that scientific naturalism is oblivious to the priority of the world as the space of meaning and does not recognize the need for specifically philosophical methods, especially transcendental and existential phenomenological ones, for investigating and understanding it.

Many of the essays take this phenomenological charge against naturalism as the background against which to consider whether there may be ways to revise phenomenology and naturalism in order to make them compatible or somehow reconcilable. Central to these discussions is the problem of consciousness. One approach, known as the "naturalizing phenomenology" project (Petitot et al. 1999; Roy et al. 1999), seeks to absorb phenomenological analyses of consciousness into some kind of naturalistic framework. Another approach, "phenomenologizing nature," uses phenomenology to enrich our understanding of nature, especially living being and the body, in order to do justice to consciousness as a natural phenomenon. Ultimately, both strategies are necessary and must be pursued in a complementary and mutually supporting way, if phenomenology is not to be reduced to or eliminated in favor of scientific naturalism, and if naturalism is not to be rejected in favor of metaphysically dualist or idealist forms of phenomenology.

This idea informs the first paper, by Zahavi. He criticizes the naturalizing phenomenology project for failing to appreciate that the problem of consciousness includes the transcendental problem of accounting for consciousness as a necessary condition of possibility for objectivity. This problem is not addressed by using phenomenology to advance analyses of empirical consciousness for the purpose of bridging or closing the explanatory gap between physical nature and subjective experience, especially as the gap is seen from the perspective of scientific naturalism. In other words, the issue, for phenomenology, is not physicalism versus dualism; it is to investigate consciousness as one of the principal necessary conditions of possibility for the framework of intelligibility that science presupposes, including the empirical science of consciousness as a natural phenomenon. Nevertheless, Zahavi thinks that two alternative ways to pursue naturalized phenomenology can maintain a commitment to phenomenology as a transcendental project. First, phenomenology can collaborate with empirical science, especially in the investigation of consciousness, by providing analyses that can inform experimental design while also refining these analyses in light of empirical evidence. This approach follows Husserl's conception of phenomenological psychology as a local or "regional" investigation of psychological phenomena, in contrast to transcendental phenomenology as a global philosophical investigation of the conditions of intelligibility for any phenomenon. Second, phenomenology can revise the concept of nature and the classical dichotomy between the empirical and the transcendental by revealing the transcendental status of the self-organizing and sense-making capacities of biological systems (Zahavi identifies this approach with my book, Mind in Life).

Rudolf Bernet's contribution can be read as an example of this second approach. He focuses on the body and the phenomenology of bodily self-experience. On the basis of a thorough explication of Husserl's analyses of bodily sensations, the experience of the body in touch and vision, and the body's dependence on material circumstances (see Husserl 1989), Bernet argues that the concrete unity of the body's living and experientially lived aspects rules out an ontological dualism of consciousness and physical nature, and cannot be understood properly from either the perspective of the phenomenology of transcendental consciousness or the perspective of scientific naturalism. Instead, it requires a form of phenomenology that sees the body as a "legitimate naturalization of consciousness," that is, a form of phenomenology that understands the body as at once concretely natural and transcendentally constitutive of the world as the space of meaning. Bernet also argues that these insights into the body are absent from Heidegger's phenomenology.

In one of the more original papers, Ratcliffe undertakes to construct an argument for the philosophical primacy of phenomenology over naturalism from various lines of thought found in Husserl and Merleau-Ponty. To this end, he presents an account of what he calls the "sense of reality," which consists not simply in taking certain things to be there, but in grasping the world in perception and thought as an open space of possibilities of presence and absence. For example, we are able to grasp experientially the possibility of something's being present to perception versus its presence being dubitable or imagined or anticipated. Following Husserl, Ratcliffe claims that our ability to distinguish between "is" and "is not" presupposes an understanding of the world as a richly structured cognitive and affective possibility space.

On this basis, he argues as follows: Science is concerned only with revealing what is the case; scientific naturalism restricts itself to what science delivers and thus to what is the case; therefore, scientific naturalism fails to accommodate the space of possibilities presupposed by the intelligibility of something's being the case; the space of possibilities is a phenomenological achievement; therefore, phenomenology cannot be naturalized. Although one might question whether this argument is sound -- for example, by questioning the truth of the premise that science is concerned only with revealing what is the case -- the argument can be taken as a challenge to the scientific naturalist to come up with an account of the experiential sense of reality that science presupposes and on which it depends. Appealing to physicalism is not sufficient for this task, because the issue "is not about what kinds of worldly entities there are or what those entities are made up of; it is about recognising a phenomenological achievement that is presupposed by the intelligibility of any enquiry concerning what the world does and does not contain" (p. 81).

Ratcliffe also describes how the sense of reality as an experiential possibility space is altered in mental illnesses such as schizophrenia. Phenomenology is important for specifying how the cognitive and affective possibilities offered by things are dramatically changed in mental illness. This discussion converges with Fredrik Svenaeus' illuminating discussion of illness experience and how purely naturalistic theories of health and illness as biophysiological phenomena leave out the constitutively intentional and normative features of health and illness that phenomenology is needed to reveal.

Another original effort comes from Michael Wheeler, who examines the tension between transcendental thinking and naturalism by asking whether transcendental phenomenology and cognitive science can be reconciled. He uses John McDowell's (1989) distinction between "constitutive understanding" and "enabling understanding" to effect this reconciliation. Whereas constitutive understanding concerns that which makes a given phenomenon be the phenomenon that it is, enabling understanding concerns the causal processes that generate and realize a given phenomenon in the world. Wheeler proposes that phenomenology provides a constitutive understanding of the mental phenomena for which a corresponding cognitive science determines the underlying causal processes. At the same time, the causal processes that cognitive science discovers may lead phenomenology to revise its conception of the mental phenomena under investigation.

Such bidirectional influence is Wheeler's version of the idea that cognitive science and phenomenology can be mutually enlightening and reciprocally constraining (for earlier statements, see Varela, Thompson, and Rosch (1991), Varela (1996), Gallagher (1997), and Thompson (2007)). Wheeler illustrates this idea, using everyday skilled action as his example, by drawing on phenomenological analyses from Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Hubert Dreyfus, and combining them with cognitive science accounts from neurophysiology and robotics research. He concludes by proposing that to reconcile naturalism and transcendental phenomenology we need naturalism to be "minimal" and the transcendental to be "domesticated." "Minimal naturalism" requires phenomenological accounts not to conflict with science but allows for the possibility that empirical science may not be able to illuminate certain cognitive phenomena (e.g., constitutively normative or ethical ones), whereas the "domesticated transcendental" takes the necessary conditions of possibility for human cognition to be historically contingent (where "history" includes natural and cultural history).

Thomas Baldwin's contribution presents a similar view through a critical reading of Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception. Baldwin argues that although Merleau-Ponty is right to reject reductionistic accounts of bodily experience and intentionality, and insightful in his view that natural science presupposes a fundamental bodily intentionality that configures the perceived world as spatiotemporal, he is wrong that perception is not, in his words, "an event of nature," and therefore not susceptible to scientific explanation. In Baldwin's reading, Merleau-Ponty's arguments for this view depend on problematic idealist assumptions that even a minimal naturalist will reject. Nevertheless, natural science is not sufficient for explaining perceptual intentionality, to the extent that perceptual content is constituted by cultural elements that are a matter of historical traditions and not scientific laws.

David Morris pursues a more radical approach, which he calls the "phenomenological reconfiguring of nature." He follows Merleau-Ponty in using phenomenology to trace the emergence of meaning from the body, while using contemporary evolutionary-developmental biology ("evo-devo") to show how life-regulation processes generate forms of meaning or sense-making that underlie and motivate human conceptual cognition. For Morris, life is a "transcendental field" prior to reflective consciousness, and is both causally enabling and constitutive of mind and consciousness.

Eran Dorfman's contribution is also based on Merleau-Ponty. Using ideas from the Phenomenology of Perception, Dorfman proposes that perceptual experience is the source of what Husserl called the "objectivist attitude" that takes the object to exist apart from consciousness and thereby neglects the role that consciousness or subjectivity plays in constituting it as an object of experience. Dorfman suggests that objectivism is an essential characteristic of lived experience and therefore the task for phenomenology is not to contest it but to trace its genesis.

Whereas the foregoing essays aim to preserve a role for phenomenology as some kind of transcendental investigation, David Roden argues that phenomenology should be retained only as a descriptive, empirical method for providing data about experience. This method must be recognized as limited, because it cannot penetrate "dark phenomena" that are not available to introspection or reflective intuition, such as very fine-grained perceptual discriminations of shades of color that cannot be held in memory, or the deep structure of temporal experience. Roden's discussion of these dark phenomena is illuminating, but his conclusion about the status of phenomenology does not follow. Although he is right that phenomenology cannot be a completely autonomous investigation, but rather must be informed by experimental investigations, it hardly follows that all that phenomenology can do is provide data about what is available to introspection. On the contrary, as the articles by Zahavi, Ratcliffe, Wheeler, and Morris demonstrate, phenomenology can provide new concepts and models for enriching our understanding of nature.

Besides these discussions of phenomenology and naturalism, the volume contains essays on the phenomenology of the ethical cultivation of virtue (Jonathan Webber), on science, ethics, and moral realism (James Lenman), on Kant and Kierkegaard on freedom and evil (Alison Assiter), and on German idealist philosophy of nature (Iain Hamilton Grant). Given these disparate topics and the fact that none of the essays engages with any of the others, the volume lacks unity and coherence. Nevertheless, it serves as an important resource for current thinking about phenomenology and naturalism.


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