Phenomenology and Philosophy of Mind

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David Woodruff Smith and Amie L. Thomasson (eds.), Phenomenology and Philosophy of Mind, Oxford University Press, 2005, 322pp. $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 978-0-19-927245-7.

Reviewed by Shaun Gallagher, University of Central Florida



A volume dedicated to exploring connections between phenomenology and the philosophy of mind is especially welcome at this point since there has been so much recent interest in relating phenomenology to the cognitive sciences and to issues in the analytic philosophy of mind. As the introduction by Smith and Thomasson makes clear, both phenomenology and philosophy of mind can be understood as disciplines and as traditions.

As a tradition, Phenomenology (I’ll capitalize the term when used in this sense) is associated with continental thinkers like Brentano, Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty. As a discipline the editors define phenomenology (I’ll use lower case for this sense) as “the study of conscious experience as lived, as experienced from the first-person point of view …” (p. 1, but see pp. 7-8 for a slightly broader view). Of course, if the tradition of Phenomenology has any say in what constitutes the discipline of phenomenology, then the proposed definition signals a narrow view of that discipline. There is an enormous wealth of discussion, analysis, and argumentation in the Phenomenological tradition that is not focused on conscious experience. In Husserl’s Logical Investigations, for example, one finds a critique of psychologism; a defense of the irreducibility of logic and the ideality of meaning; an analysis of pictorial representations; a theory of the part-whole relation; a sophisticated account of intentionality; and an epistemological clarification of the relation between concepts and intuitions. Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty certainly add to the list of topics that are simply not reducible to a concern with first-person experience.

Furthermore, one might be motivated to ask, after reading the editors’ Introduction, whether Phenomenology as a tradition is over and done with. All of the figures listed by the editors – Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, Ingarden, Gurwitsch – are dead, and the editors’ grammar and vocabulary suggest a post-mortem: references to the tradition itself are in the past tense, prefixed by the term ‘classical’. In contrast, most of the figures listed as part of the “contemporary” philosophy-of-mind tradition are alive and relatively well – Armstrong, Putnam, Fodor, Dennett, Searle, and the Churchlands. Are there any living Phenomenologists who could be included in a tradition that may be more alive than the list of names would lead us to believe. How about Dreyfus, Føllesdal, Petitot, Tugendhat, Waldenfels, or Zahavi? Isn’t the tradition just as alive as the discipline, which the editors suggest is “ongoing” (p. 2)?

The collection is composed of 14 essays, and I will not be able to comment on all of them in the detail they deserve. At best I can give a brief indication of the contents of these chapters, and a few critical comments.

The first essay, by Paul Livingston, investigates the relations between functionalism and Phenomenology. His historical analysis is insightful, but it also pushes into clarity an issue that seems to plague both houses, and if unresolved may lead to an undesirable dead end. If we take functionalism to be inspired by an attempt to analyze and explain psychological states by analyzing the vocabulary of mentalistic description, and if we understand Phenomenology as a logical and conceptual analysis of the structure of experience, then these two approaches are close cousins. The difference seems to be in functionalism’s openness to naturalistic and empirical causal explanation, in contrast to Phenomenology’s withdrawal from ("bracketing", in Husserl's terminology) such descriptions. Practically speaking, however, since functionalist theory developed almost exclusively as a logical and conceptual analysis, with little reference to empirical data, this is not a large difference. Such conceptual analyses, Livingston suggests, may thwart the study of consciousness precisely because they are conceptual and theoretical. That consciousness resists both functionalist and Phenomenological analysis is “one instance of a more general and perennial phenomenon: the resistance of subjective experience to broadly structuralist practices of conceptual and logical analysis” (37).

Livingston doesn’t suggest a way forward, but if we set aside the kind of mysterianism that one finds in someone like McGinn, where we are simply not up to the task of explaining consciousness given the finite possibilities of the way that we can conceptualize things, then one possibility is for both functionalist and Phenomenological approaches to pay closer attention to the empirical sciences. I think that this is precisely what many contemporary Phenomenologists and phenomenologists and philosophers of mind are doing today, including some of the contributors to this volume. Taylor Carman, for example. In his essay on the inescapability of phenomenology, he suggests that, in contrast to the claims of someone like Dennett, phenomenology is a necessary component of any full scientific account of consciousness and cognition. He worries about recent considerations that border on behaviorism and eliminativism, including not only Dennett’s heterophenomenology, but also the enactive theorists, such as Noë and O’Regan, and contends that they miss something important insofar as they fail to consider certain normative and intentional aspects of experience. He appeals to the Phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty and Charles Taylor as an alternative that takes these aspects seriously.

David Woodruff Smith, in a section on self-awareness and self-knowledge, offers a critique of higher-order representational theories of consciousness and examines the traditional Phenomenological alternative, namely, a concept of a same-level (or first-order) pre-reflective self-awareness, which he calls a reflexive inner awareness. He integrates this with a discussion of language and John Perry’s analysis of indexicals, and shows that reflexive inner awareness is a modal character of intentional experience rather than a second or higher-order act of self-awareness. The phenomenological account thus fits well with the semantics of indexical expressions as analyzed in analytic philosophy of mind.

If inner self-awareness is pre- or non-reflective insofar as it is not the result of a reflective observation of our own experience, this raises the question of how we gain more explicit knowledge of our own experience. Amie Thomasson explores this question and considers the difference between observational introspection and the kind of Phenomenological method proposed by Husserl. She outlines the argument against equating Phenomenological analysis with introspection, and shows that the former actually takes its start from world-oriented experience. Indeed, Thomasson suggests that Sellars’ idea that our self-knowledge is better understood as an aspect of our knowledge of the world actually derives from Husserl, and that Sellars borrowed some aspects of Husserl’s method. Thomasson goes on to develop an innovative way of understanding the laws that allow one to move, methodically, from first-order world experiences to knowledge of our own mental experiences.

Galen Strawson’s paper is seriously concerned with vocabulary, and the way terminological choices can mislead us in our thinking about something like intentionality. His analysis is phenomenological in the non-traditional sense, and perhaps more precisely, it is predominantly a linguistic analysis about phenomenological issues. Although Strawson denies he is a “linguistic perscriptivist”, he certainly takes a turn at being a linguistic “stipulativist,” freely stipulating the meanings of words for use in his analysis. Some Phenomenenologists would surely embrace his claims that intentionality is a mark of the mental, or, is essentially experiential, and that we shouldn’t call non-experiential states, e.g., states found in robots or thermostats, or representational aspects of pictures or words, intentional. They would also agree with Strawson’s claim that there is something it is like to think of the concept of justice in the abstract, and this is experientially different from what it is like to think that grapes grow on vines; and this difference is not simply one of semantic content. Phenomenologists are quite familiar with the point that qualitative aspects of experience are not limited to sensory experiences, not the least from struggling with the texts of Husserl and Heidegger. There is something it is like to understand Husserl, and that is very different from what it is like to understand Heidegger.

Strawson argues against too much intentionality, which we might get if we follow philosophers of mind who would make everything about cognition representational and attribute intentionality to non-conscious states. It may be, however, that Strawson ends up with too little intentionality since he limits it to what is occurrently conscious. Conscious beliefs are intentional; but unconscious beliefs are not. Non-conscious beliefs are better regarded as dispositions to behave in certain ways, and as such they “are not properly counted as intentional phenomena” (45). Strawson, like many philosophers of mind, believes that there is a large number of such unconscious beliefs – “tens, hundreds of thousands of dispositions to behave in all sorts of ways, verbal and non-verbal, and to go into all sorts of states, mental and non-mental” (58). Actually, if we think of beliefs in this way, then “hundreds of thousands” is a serious underestimation. For example, if I know that the world population is somewhere between 6.5 and 7 billion (see, then I have at least 6.5 billion beliefs about the world population. For example, I believe that the world population is greater than 1; and I believe the world population is greater than 2; …. and I believe the world population is greater than 6.5 billion, etc. Indeed, I have at least an infinity of beliefs concerning the concept of infinity, since I believe that 1< ∞, that 2< ∞, and so on. Given all of these unconscious belief dispositions, there seems to be a serious overcrowding of beliefs inside my head. Inside my head? Yes, because when we ask what precisely a belief disposition that is not currently conscious is, Strawson considers the “standard naturalist physicalist answer is: a certain arrangement of neurons” (58). I agree that the brain is complex, but even if the various possible neuronal combinations approach infinity, I find it difficult to believe that in my short lifetime I’ve been able to amass so many beliefs. Rather, it seems much more parsimonious to think that I have learned how to formulate answers to whether 6.5 billion is less than infinity, and I do so whenever I’m asked. I don’t need to have this belief stored away all the time; I only need the skill to answer the question, and then, as a belief, I can let it go.

The same for “having” dispositions that shape my behavioral responses to specific environmental demands. Are my dispositions stored in my brain, simpliciter; or are they episodic, that is, do they come and go according to circumstances that involve a distribution of neuronal states, body states, and broadly (to included social and cultural aspects) environmental states? I think there are complicated issues here about externalism (about which Strawson doesn’t seem too enthusiastic). Perhaps we need to think about dispositions to behave as finite, but also as encompassing something more than just beliefs, and more than what can be contained in a neuronal storehouse. This gets us back to the issue of just how much intentionality is the right amount. I would summarize Strawson’s position as: too many beliefs, and too little intentionality. Certainly not all non-conscious dispositions are beliefs, and not all non-conscious dispositions are reducible to neuronal states. Picking up on a point made by Dreyfus and Kelly against Dennett,[1] I suggest that Strawson underpopulates the intentional realm even as he overestimates the belief contents of mind. Neither perceiving nor skilled coping is equivalent to believing, but perceiving and coping belong to the intentional realm, even if much of our coping behavior, or many aspects of coping behavior, go on non-consciously.

On the other side of this discussion, Johannes Brandl wants to overpopulate the intentional realm with “mental representations,” immanent vehicular objects that mediate a relation between the experiencing subject and the intentional object. He explores many of the distinctions that Strawson wants to dismiss. Although it is not clear what the term ‘real’ could mean in this context, and, as Brandl admits (p. 179) it is not clear how such mental representations could be realized in the brain, and setting aside a variety of arguments against Fodorian mental representations, Brandl claims that these entities are “definitely real” (179). This seems to be one version of internalism – no need to go outside of the mind to find something that is the real basis for intentionality – and a far cry from Thomasson’s view that Phenomenology understands the structure of experience in terms of its world-relatedness.

A different form of internalism, however, which seems more threatening to certain externalist views of Phenomenology can be found in Bickle and Ellis’s essay on “Phenomenology and Cortical Microstimulation.” This is a curious essay in which the co-authors seem to underestimate the nature of the serious challenge they pose vis-à-vis Phenomenology. Microstimulation of specific cortical areas can induce experiences that seem world-related. This is familiar from the well-known Penfield experiments. Bickle updates the reader with the latest experiments along this line conducted by Newsome and colleagues at Stanford. The fact that microstimulation of certain neuronal areas can generate consciousness of specific kinds clearly supports Bickle’s reductionist views.

Ellis, who confesses to being a non-reductionist, treats these experiments as perfectly consistent with Phenomenology. In one sense this is correct. The Phenomenological Reduction (which, of course, is a different sense of reduction, so I’ll capitalize it and keep it consistent with my capitalization policy on Phenomenology) brackets all metaphysical theories, including reductionistic ones. Phenomenology may thus be consistent with a number of metaphysical positions, including neural reductionism. At the same time, Ellis takes Husserl’s analysis, and Phenomenology more generally, to be exclusive of causal analysis. To claim that X (some object in the world) causes Y (some intentional experience) is to say more than Phenomenology is licensed to say, precisely because of the Reduction. What makes the microstimulation experiments interesting and useful for Phenomenology, according to Ellis, is precisely the fact that the experiments demonstrate that one does not need an external object in order to cause intentional content. For there to be intentional content, there is no causal requirement that there be an external real object that has an effect on the psychophysical subject. We can experience things that are simply not there, e.g., when we imagine a unicorn, or in the case of hallucination.

But if the microstimulation experiments motivate a bracketing of the sort of causal account that some 18th-century empiricists might have given, they certainly do not motivate a bracketing of the sort of causal account that 21st-century neuroscientists seem inclined to give, namely, that intentional content is generated by neuronal processes which are sufficient unto themselves – no world required, at least not as intended object. Here we have internalist tendencies coming at us from both sides: no need to be in-the-world (in contrast to what Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty might claim), since we, and the world, are already in our brains. In this regard Ellis is happy to make Husserl an internalist – certainly one possible reading of the Phenomenological Reduction, but certainly not the only one (see, e.g., Thomasson’s essay).

Bickle and Ellis are equally happy to eliminate folk psychological causal accounts. They indicate that when we apply causal concepts to experience, “we end up with the problems of ‘folk psychology’ that both serious phenomenology and contemporary neuroscience are interested in avoiding” (p. 156). They are thus quite happy to team Husserl with Paul Churchland, despite Churchland’s misunderstanding of the Phenomenological Reduction (p. 156). But we have to note that there are different ways to be eliminativist in regard to folk psychology. Churchland, and perhaps Bickle, would clearly champion a reductive translation of folk explanation to neuronal explanation--but they are also motivated to do the same with phenomenology; Husserl, and perhaps Ellis, would champion a Reduction of folk explanation in favor of a close Phenomenological description of experience, but Husserl, at least, may also be motivated to do the same with neuroscientific causal explanation.

One thing that complicates any staking of claims in the internalist or externalist camp it precisely what seems to be lacking in the cortical microstimulation experiments, namely, a clear Phenomenological report of the subject’s experience. The subjects in Newsome’s lab were rhesus monkeys, and, well, they apparently not only refused to provide Phenomenological reports, but they weren’t even forthcoming with phenomenological reports. Penfield’s patients were likely giving folk phenomenological reports, and it is not always clear how to judge such reports. This is ignored by Bickle and Ellis: “what is most remarkable about induced phenomenology is that the experience may appear to the subject not merely as a mental image, as in daydreams and conjured fantasies, but as an actual percept that seems to be actually present. When D.F.’s temporal lobe was stimulated she heard music not as if she were imagining or remembering it, but as if it were actually playing on a radio” (p. 157). Certainly, this may be what D.F. reported--literally, “I hear music again. It is like the radio … [I] actually heard it” (p. 142); but is this a Phenomenological description or a folk psychological claim? Bickle and Ellis go even further. Although they note some serious limitations in Penfield’s experiments (p. 143), they suggest that D.F.’s descriptions were so precise that they rule out what Sartre had claimed for the Phenomenological method, namely that “careful reflection will reveal the difference between a mental image and a percept …” (157). It apparently seems obvious to them that if the epileptic patient D.F. is unable to tell the difference between an experience generated by neural stimulation and an experience generated by a worldly encounter, then there is no improvement on this description to be made through the use of Phenomenological method. So it is perhaps surprising that they nonetheless conclude that Phenomenology may be a useful tool in neuroscientific study. “When searching for mechanisms, a useful heuristic is to know something about the phenomena we seek to explain” (161).

The chapter by Richard Tiezen takes up the question of how we can be conscious of abstract objects and how the concept of intentionality is important for sorting out this question. Someone like Penrose, who tries to explain consciousness of abstract objects in terms of brain processes is working at the wrong level of description and overlooks the significance of intentionality in this regard. Tiezen is partial to the contrasting view of Gödel, who was familiar with Husserl’s work, and who seems to recognize the intentionality of mental processes as essential for consciousness of abstract objects. Tiezen then produces an analysis of this process in terms of noematic shifts from perceptual experience to something that is an abstract object or state of affairs, similar to the Heideggerian shift from everyday dealings with Zuhanden instruments, to a more conceptually informed Vorhandenheit, a shift, moreover, that is important for doing science. Such shifts involve idealizations and abstractions of different types, and the task of Phenomenology is to identify and analyze these cognitive states.

Wayne Martin’s essay explores the “logic of consciousness,” a phrase that Martin uses to refer to Husserl’s idea that conscious states legitimate and correct one another in “evidentiary relations of confirmation, refutation, legitimation, and the like” (p. 204). It is not just that conscious states replace one another in succession, but that they seem to involve logical relations (such as consistency) vis-à-vis their intentional relations. Martin attempts to cash this out in terms of mereological relations that suggest a holistic approach to consciousness (in opposition to an atomistic approach in which we would think of consciousness “as a kind of dynamic mosaic, with the identity of each tile fixed by its own specific quality, quite independently of the role it plays in the mosaic as a whole” [210]). Intentional determinacy and appropriate forms of consistency for specific kinds of intentionality (consistency in belief is differentiated from consistency in fear or desire) point to such holistic relations. Martin concludes by providing a helpful discussion of how these concepts relate to the critique of psychologism and to contemporary cognitive science.

The chapters by Tiezen and Martin raise issues that are ignored in most discussions of consciousness found in the philosophy of mind. Sean Kelly’s chapter also takes up a topic that is infrequently discussed in recent studies of consciousness, although it was often discussed in the first part of the 20th century--the question of the temporal structure of awareness. He examines the theory of the specious present, as found in James, Broad, and others, and he contrasts this theory with a theory of retention, the roots of which he traces to Locke and Hume, although the best expression of it is found in Husserl. Kelly provides some interesting historical notes on these approaches, and a critique of the notion of the specious present, which leads him to suggest that Husserl’s model of retention is superior to the specious present account. Kelly concludes by suggesting that further thinking about Merleau-Ponty’s notions of gaining and losing a perceptual grip on an indeterminate scene might help to give us a feel for what it is to experience something as just-about-to-be or as just-having-been.

Kay Mathiesen adds a discussion of a different sort of unity to the logical and temporal kinds explored by Martin and Kelly, namely, an intersubjective unity that might be found in collective consciousness. She explores different models of collective consciousness as inadequate: the group mind, which fails to capture plurality; the emergent mind, which, defined as a second-order consciousness that emerges from the interaction of individuals, runs into the problem that no one is aware of it; and the socially embedded mind, which fails to provide an account of collectivity. Mathiesen turns to Husserl and Alfred Schutz to discover a better model, although these too appear to be inadequate. Mathiesen finally turns to concepts of empathy (Stein) and, something more familiar to philosophers of mind, a somewhat standard view of the mentalistic task of how we understand “mental states of others” (243), specifically a version of simulation theory. I think that Mathiesen does put simulation theory to an innovative use, however. In this regard, let me mention Matthew Ratcliffe’s recent book, Rethinking Commonsense Psychology, in which he makes a similar move.[2] He suggests that in our attempts to understand others we do not attempt to simulate/mindread the other’s mental state; rather we simulate our possible relationship to the other person--a relationship that is better described in terms of embodied interactions. In addressing the question of collective subjectivity, Mathiesen suggests that “we are able to simulate the states of a collective subject of which we are members” (247). Mathiesen, however, continues to conceive of this process as one of simulating minds--a collective mind--collective beliefs, thoughts, and attitudes. In contrast, one could develop Ratcliffe’s suggestion in the direction taken by Mathiesen. That is, one could conceive of a collective intersubjectivity in terms of simulating how “we” as embodied subjects would typically behave and interact with one another. This way of putting it would actually be more faithful to Husserl’s example of an interpersonal unity, insofar as “ideals, values, and goals are embedded in our practices, habits … [and] We often say such things as ‘We should do such and such’” (247). No need to talk about a collective “consciousness” in this case, or to try to determine whether we mean that literally or metaphorically.

The final section of the volume concerns perception, sensation, and action. Clotilde Calabi offers an account of how to think of reasons for action in terms of perceptual saliences rather than in terms of internal beliefs. I act in a certain way, not because I have a certain belief or desire, but because the environment elicits the action. She cites the recent work of Noë on enactive perception, as well as Gibson’s notion of affordances, to develop an object theory of reasons. In the Gibsonian model, for example, perceptual saliencies are part of the objective world. But Calabi argues that saliences are normative properties, by which I take her to mean that they are properties that arise through my perceptual interactions with the world, and are guides for my action. In her turn of phrase, “My idea is that, for this class of reasons, it is the world that wears the trousers, although the world is a world that the agent has in view” (264).

Charles Siewert’s essay on sensorimotor intentionality strikes me as very consistent with Calabi’s general phenomenological approach, but builds more directly on the work of the Phenomenological tradition from Merleau-Ponty through Dreyfus. It also links up to Kelly’s discussion of temporality. Both Kelly and Siewert cite the same example of perceptual indeterminacy from Merleau-Ponty. If I am walking along a beach and see in the distance a ship that has run aground against the background of a forest that borders on the sand dune, it may at first appear that what later becomes clear as the ship’s mast indeterminately blends into the forest in a way that I could see it as the mast or as a tree. Kelly cites this as an example of an experience of something that is just-about-to-be, since I anticipate that it is in fact the mast, but the perception is not yet clear. Siewert also takes this experience to involve anticipation, but he is interested in what makes seeing the mast as a tree a mistaken perception. The anticipation, and whether it is fulfilled or proven wrong, is closely linked to what one does (p. 285), where what one does is some kind of activity that allows a better look, and this is based on sensorimotor skills. The intentionality involved in this experience is not best described as forming mental representations and comparing content. For Siewert, it is the kind of sensorimotor intentionality that Merleau-Ponty was trying to get at. What is interesting, given that Kelly and Siewert appeal to the same example, is to ask whether temporality, especially the temporality that is captured in Husserl’s retentional-protentional model, is intimately connected with our sensorimotor abilities. If so, it seems that Husserl’s model might also serve neuroscientists who insist on the anticipatory nature of sensory-motor processes.[3] Siewert suggests that doing the requisite action (and being prepared to do it) is not “a consequence or result of my anticipation of further visual appearances; it constitutes such anticipation” (290). Siewert may be right, but I think that this is a claim that deserves much more consideration. If he is right, then it is not so much that something like Husserl’s retentional-protentional model, which is primarily thought of as a model of mental experience, can mapped onto sensory-motor processes, but that that temporal structure of our mental experience is already shaped by the embodied processes connected with action possibilities. Thus, at the end of his essay, Siewert rightly raises the question of whether such experiences are possible for a disembodied (e.g., brain-in-the-vat) entity.

This leads us to the final chapter by José Luis Bermúdez on the phenomenology of bodily awareness. He focuses on certain distinctive modes of awareness of our own bodies, some more conscious than others, and some shaped by non-conscious proprioceptive information. Where Merleau-Ponty appears to place certain limitations on what natural science can tell us about the lived body, Bermúdez attempts to show how science may not be so limited, and may be able to work with Phenomenology to capture essential aspects of the experienced and experiencing body. He focuses specifically on understanding the experienced spatiality of the lived body as categorically different from the experienced spatiality of the world. As Merleau-Ponty well knew, we can develop an understanding of this difference from the study of various pathologies, and Bermúdez follows the same route in order to specify a number of different sources of information about the body, especially in the context of action. This provides the means for a more detailed interpretation of the famous Schneider example in the Phenomenology of Perception, but more importantly, it leads to a better understanding of the difference between the proprioceptive frame of reference within which one experiences one’s body, and the egocentric frame of reference for perception and action. This differentiation of spatiality not only clarifies our phenomenological experience and certain pathological cases, it also is consistent with scientific explanations of motor control, which further facilitates our understanding of bodily experience and action.

The scope of this collection of essays is important to note. By attending to and developing the contributions of Phenomenological analysis we not only gain rich insights into many of the standard issues explored by philosophy of mind, we also open new areas of consideration. The themes covered in this book range from the usual questions about phenomenal consciousness, self-awareness, intentionality, representation, perception, action and higher orders of cognition, to topics that are less frequently discussed in philosophy of mind, such as the temporality of experience, consciousness of abstract objects, the logical unity of consciousness, and the notion of collective consciousness. The essays are engaging and certainly worth studying. They also suggest that the Phenomenological tradition is alive and well.

[1] Dreyfus, H. and Kelly, S. “Heterophenomenology: Heavy-handed Sleight-of-hand.” Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences 6.1-2 (in press).

[2] Matthew Ratcliffe. Rethinking Commonsense Psychology. London: Palgrave-Macmillan, 2006. I think Ratcliffe’s move is interestingly innovative, but I remain a skeptic about simulation theory (see S. Gallagher, “Logical and phenomenological arguments against simulation theory,” in D. Hutto and M. Ratcliffe (eds.), Folk Psychology Re-assessed, 63-78. Dordrecht: Springer Publishers; and S. Gallagher, “Simulation trouble,” Social Neuroscience [in press]).

[3] See especially Alain Berthoz and Jean-Luc Petit. Phénoménologie et physiologie de l’action. Paris: Odile Jacob, 2006.