Phenomenology and Virtue Ethics

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Kevin Hermberg and Paul Gyllenhammer (eds.), Phenomenology and Virtue Ethics, Bloomsbury, 2013, 243pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781780937021.

Reviewed by Donald A. Landes, Concordia University


Kevin Hermberg concedes at the outset of his brief introduction, it may at first glance seem arbitrary or artificial to bring together virtue ethics and phenomenology (1). The roots of virtue ethics are certainly distant from Husserlian phenomenology, and the phenomenological tradition itself has in many ways remained an uneasy conversation partner with normative thought in the major traditions. Nevertheless, Husserl's late emphasis on what Hermberg calls "an ethics of the person" perhaps already suggests that the connection to a character-based ethics being sought in this volume is more than merely arbitrary. Of traditional approaches to ethics, virtue ethics seems particularly open to the contribution offered by the phenomenologist's focus on descriptive accounts of habit, intentionality, and the "encounter with things and people in the world" (2). Thus, there seem to be some good reasons for accepting Hermberg's suggestion that drawing the two fields of inquiry together might garner a fruitful exchange in which phenomenology offers virtue ethics a rigorous description of ethical experience, and in which virtue ethics offers phenomenology a normative orientation for its unfolding understanding of the human self as being in the world with others and oriented toward value. The essays in this excellent collection offer an exciting insight into the richness of this potential (and emerging) exchange. They will be helpful for students or scholars of phenomenology and/or virtue ethics, and promise to generate new directions of research between these two fields.

The book is divided into three parts: Phenomenology and the Traditio, Theoretical and Contemporary Comparative Accounts;, and Application of Phenomenology as a Virtue Discipline. Each includes four or five chapters, each written by well-established scholars or emerging thinkers working at the intersection of phenomenology and value theory. The introduction to the volume is notably brief; more perhaps could have been said to create links between the essays or to justify the choices made regarding the topics and organization. Nevertheless, the chapters are to be recommended as either stand-alone contributions on the thinker or concept in question, or as together initiating the conversation sought by the editors. In this review, I explore some salient moments from this impressive collection, with the aim of highlighting what I take to be a key and exciting contribution that it makes: the honing of a phenomenological description of the experience of virtuous action as an alternative to ethical theories that attempt to codify moral rules, without thereby reducing ethical action to mere arbitrary choice.

Phenomenology and the tradition

The connection between phenomenology and virtue ethics is established from the very first chapter, "Phainomenon and Logos in Aristotle's Ethics" by Lawrence J. Hatab. Hatab presents Aristotle as "the first phenomenologist who thought about virtue" (9), and identifies several ways in which Aristotle's approach might be considered phenomenological[1] For instance, Aristotle insists that philosophy remain an investigation of "observable phainomena" (9), and this represents a genuine commitment to embodied and perceptual being-in-the-world. Or again, Hatab identifies in Aristotle a persistent commitment to considering language as it is used to describe phenomena, which indicates for Aristotle "an intrinsic correlation between language and being" (10). Hatab then explores how a phenomenological lens furthers our understanding of Aristotle's virtue ethics. Hatab emphasizes the role of logos in Aristotle's ethics, which sets the stage for his extremely valuable discussion of how genuinely virtuous action occurs without deliberation such that the practical syllogism is best understood as a "reconstruction of an action rather than a determination of it" (24). As Hatab argues, "with regard to a fully virtuous person in unexceptional circumstances, a logos of ethical action need not mean rational justification, but rather an articulation that helps us to make sense of an action that is not schematized in advance" (24). As a result, we can (through the phenomenological insistence on the lived and immediate experience described from within the unfolding of virtuous action) properly understand the secondary nature of rational deliberation for an Aristotelian approach to virtuous action.

Chapter 2, by Michelle Rebidoux, is arguably misplaced, since Michel Henry's work does not specifically take up the virtue tradition. Nevertheless, Rebidoux  argues that Henry's work can connect to virtue ethics through the concept of Life and through his late exploration of a Christian ethics. Those unfamiliar with Henry's language initially will find this essay difficult, but there are moments when Rebidoux achieves an admirable clarity while attempting to present a complex thinker in a brief chapter. According to Rebidoux, Henry's notion of an act of mercy focuses not so much on the Other who receives the act, but rather on "the cultivation of a certain inner orientation or virtue" (39) of the actor.

Matthew King, offers a way in which this orientation toward virtue might be understood: as phenomenology itself, broadly construed. Developing this idea via Plato and Heidegger, King presents a defense of the strong claim that phenomenology itself is the most adequate construal of "the cardinal virtue." He argues that throughout Heidegger's work there is a sense in which "phenomenology," taken broadly, is the methodology of cultivating the responding-opening of being. As such, doing phenomenology is what it means for Heidegger to be doing philosophy well. Phenomenology is the excellence or virtue of philosophy insofar as a phenomenological disposition cultivates an opening upon being. Moreover, and I think that King is careful to make this point, here "phenomenology" does not mean the academic study of phenomenology. Rather, he suggests "being phenomenological" is "to be alive to the being of beings throughout one's life . . . and this means to be both cognitively and affectively attentive and responsive to all the ways that being presents itself" (52). This "phenomenological disposition" could, of course, be achieved without any knowledge of Husserl or Heidegger, though a study of phenomenology perhaps offers the individual some insight into becoming better everyday phenomenologists. King concludes by sketching a notion of "deep happiness," paradigmatically present in "connections with nature, other human beings, and artworks" (55). I find compelling his position that a phenomenological attitude helps us to respond to these experiences, give them substance, understand them, and understand how to return to them (56).

An interesting chapter by Eric Chelstrom on the connection between Husserl and Aristotle on complete friendship and the possibilities for extending Husserl via the social phenomenology of Alfred Schütz, is followed by the section's final chapter. In it Gregory B. Sadler connects Aristotle's virtue ethics to the phenomenology of value and affectivity in the work of Scheler and Dietrich von Hildebrand. These two early phenomenologists, as Sadler notes, can be understood as restoring "affectivity's centrality in character and personality, virtue and vice, action and practical reasoning," as well as highlighting the role of affectivity in "value-perception, response, and fundamental preference" (78). Such an emphasis counters the tradition that privileges reason over emotion in ethical reflection. By returning to Aristotle (in light of Scheler and von Hildebrand), Sadler successfully reveals in Aristotle an often underemphasized presence of affectivity underlying virtuous behavior. He presents Aristotle as not just the first phenomenologist who focuses on virtue, but also the first phenomenologist of value, a connection at stake in several entries in the following sections.

Theoretical and contemporary comparative accounts

Part II shifts from an historical exploration of phenomenology and its possibilities for virtue ethics to conceptual issues at stake in contemporary virtue theory. John J. Drummond, ("Phenomenology, Eudaimonia, and the Virtues") addresses a pressing concern for any attempt to connect phenomenology and ethics: how does a descriptive endeavor like phenomenology have anything to say within a normative field such as ethics? Drummond answers by invoking the structures of eidetic phenomenology. As he indicates, even at the level of "recognizing a part as a moment, we grasp an essential necessity, that is, the connection between this moment and the other moments necessarily supplementing it in the formation of a whole" (98). Thus, at the level of perception, we already see the structure of at least a rudimentary sense of normativity. Preferring a "phenomenological realist" approach (over an existential one) to the question of the source of value, Drummond explores how Scheler could be said to present a strong realist position, where the value grasped is conceived of as objective, mind-independent, while Husserl might be seen to offer a weak realist position, where the value grasped is intrinsically related to the valuing experience of an intentional agent.

In either case, phenomenology still seems to have nothing to say about value, and should be limited to describing our access to value. To respond to this worry, Drummond invokes the relationship between empty and full intentions, and emphasizes the dynamic movement between the two as the structure of the "experiential life phenomenology describes," a "striving for evidence" (101). Aphenomenological account of "authenticity" would thus not be captured by accounts of existential freedom, but rather by a striving for truthfulness and responsibility to evidence. In short, authenticity is the "goal, not the manner, of rational agency" (102). This allows Drummond to characterize rational agency as the telos of human being and to present the "goods of agency" as the basis for an interpretation of eudaimonia. As a result, the virtues can be identified as those traits of intellectual life (within a context of personal and political freedom) that further rational agency, such as "respect," " (intellectual) charity," and "generosity," among several others (see 108-112).

Jack Reynolds explores the contributions to virtue ethics found in the writings of Hubert Dreyfus and Charles Taylor. For Reynolds, their work suggests that any adequate moral theory must be able to provide a "sophisticated phenomenology of moral experience" (113). As such, argues Reynolds, the ethical trajectory of phenomenology tends toward an account of how character, rather than abstract moral reasoning, is the central factor in moral flourishing, and thus the methodology of phenomenology itself moves in the direction of virtue ethics. A major contribution by Reynolds is his clarification of a shared "anti-theoretical" style in these two traditions -- not, of course, that they resist all theory, but rather that they resist the assumption that ethical theories can successfully and completely "codify morality" (128). This is a recognition that morality is impoverished if it is reduced to a rule-following activity, and that a flight from the complexity of moral experience to a mechanical application of rules deprives the individual of their agency and neglects the nuanced urgencies of moral experience.

Part of the complexity of moral experience that phenomenology is particularly well situated to describe is the emotional aspect, the topic explored by Robert E. Wood, again focusing attention on Scheler and von Hildebrand. Resisting the prioritization of reason over emotion, Scheler places the heart at "the core of man," and thus as prior to "knowledge and willing" (133). Wood provides a compelling exploration of several key texts by Scheler and von Hildebrand, and carefully weaves together the two positions notably through the distinction they draw between the ego and theperson, as well as the complex nature of the virtues of humility and reverence (in contrast to pride). This essay is an excellent starting point for anyone looking to gain access to the role of value and virtue in early phenomenology, while the section's final essay, by J. Jeremy Wisnewski, invokes the implications for a contemporary phenomenological description of the experience of the virtuous person from the perspective of enactive and engaged accounts of perception and action. Wisnewski draws together J. J. Gibson's account of perception and Mihaly Csikszentmihalyi's account of "flow" in order to think through the experience of Aristotle's virtuous agentHe argues that such an approach reveals important ways in which the "self" of virtuous experience recedes, that is, the moral saint, the phronimos, experiences the world differently because of the manner in which their own self and interests step back. Although Wisnewski concedes that self-receding is necessary but not sufficient for virtue (160), his notion resonates in many ways with the descriptions offered in Part III.

Application of phenomenology as a virtue discipline

Part III considers ways in which applied phenomenology may contribute to virtue ethics, and particularly how "phenomenology offers the practitioner an avenue into 'the good life'" (5). John Russon outlines how phenomenological reflection reveals the modalities by which the world calls us to action and "calls us to agency" (165). In what amounts to a phenomenology of maturity, he identifies three primary virtues that emerge in child development and that together form us as ethical agents. First, in our earliest interactions with others we forge what Russon calls a "primary self-confidence," which is the development of a capacity to be someone. Second, he posits a "primary courage," which is a further ability that we develop to take the self we have been given by others into new situations that perhaps do not confirm our self, and even question it. Third, Russon describes how a "primary creativity" also contributes to the formation of our agency by allowing us to respond to situations that do not offer a solution. These primary virtues form the core of agents such that they can be, remain, and grow as agents. Here one can see the depth opened up by an applied phenomenological description to child and adult character development. Moreover, Russon's approach refuses to present ethical agency as enacting a codified or codifiable set of rules. Ethical agents must, he argues, develop the character to act in the context of not having all of the answers in advance, and his description of primary virtues is an excellent first approach to describing this form of mature being in the world.

A similar style can be sensed in Iain Thomson's contribution in which he presents an extension of his work on Heidegger and the philosophy of education. Thomson invokes the mentoring model where the teacher enables the student to "identify and develop his or her distinctive talents and capacities" (186). Development for the sake of character creates the possibility for a fulfilling life. The phenomenology of Heidegger, he argues, demands that we take an attitude of "ontological pluralism (or plural realism)" in which we recognize that the world invites more than one manner of its disclosure. A virtuous (phenomenological) educator, then, should "cultivate the recognition that in most situations there will be more than one right answer to questions of what to do or how best to go on" (188).

In a similar vein, John Duncan identifies an important phenomenological (existential) insight. He begins by pointing to an important aspect of the classical Greek virtue tradition that involves understanding and living according to the "natural order of things" (191). Yet the natural order of things is revealed by writers such as Nietzsche and Sartre to in fact be a "fundamental orderlessness," an abyss or a foundational contingency. Thus, phenomenological-existential (and literary) description unmasks precisely the order sought by classical ethics in codes and universalizeable rules. The process of descent, or of uncovering the groundlessness of our "familiar stories and concepts," results in a self that must dissent to that readymade world and reject its mystification. Such a "fundamental dissent" is in fact at the "heart of what we are" as ethical agents, and thus ethical agency requires that we embrace ontological pluralism and the failure of codification. Duncan concludes: "[dissent] is the virtue of existence" (210).

In the final contribution, co-editor Paul Gyllenhammer again takes up this theme by arguing that phenomenology shows how the natural (everyday) attitude limits our well-being "because of the way it takes reality as something given, ordinary, and stable" (212). The cultivation of character achieved through phenomenology promotes the virtues of enthusiasm, sympathy, and tolerance as key dispositions for taking up the world in a deeper and more fulfilling way. These virtues encourage a further engagement with our "home-world" and make possible an openness to the impact a change in environment from our regular home-world to the "wilderness" can have on our bodily being in the world. Such ways of cultivating our engagement with our world and testing its limits are precisely ways of opening the horizons that the tradition might prefer closed.

In conclusion, and as the above summary of some of the salient points in this collection demonstrates, this volume is genuinely successful in its attempt to motivate the connection between phenomenology and virtue ethics. It offers a rich and engaging presentation of this nexus and provides a valuable starting point for further research by students and scholars alike. The editors demonstrate that, indeed, bringing these two traditions together promises a continuing and important contribution to ethics.

[1] Indeed, there is a natural connection sensed here between phenomenology and Aristotle’s philosophy, and this is a connection that structures many of Heidegger’s early lecture courses. For more on the connection between Aristotle and Heideggerian philosophy, the reader will also want to consult Chapter 5 of Hatab’s book Ethics and Finitude: Heideggerian Contributions to Moral Philosophy (Rowman & Littlefield, 2000).