Phenomenology Explained: From Experience to Insight

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David Detmer, Phenomenology Explained: From Experience to Insight, Open Court, 2013, 212pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812697971.

Reviewed by Michael R. Kelly, University of San Diego


David Detmer's book commendably strains to make clear and accessible to the novice phenomenology's central mission, method, and concepts. Analytically and continentally trained philosophers should find his philosophical style approachable. And with some significant caveats, which will become clear below, I think that instructors would find helpful some of Detmer's ways of presenting the philosophical context surrounding phenomenology's emergence, its distinctive and cogent alternatives to traditional philosophical problems, and certain of its important methodological claims.

A quick glance at the title of each of the work's eight sections tells one a good deal: Introduction; Early Husserl; Middle Husserl; Late Husserl; Ethics; Polemics; Successors; Suggestions for Further Reading. The titles that mention Husserl are obvious and revealing; the titles expressing topics are a bit more concealing. Even if "Ethics" were not an attempt (quite welcome) to present Husserl's ethics; even if "Polemics" were not an interesting (but, I think, superfluous) defense of Husserl's phenomenology against two critical commentators (who, though themselves good thinkers, are) not often associated with debates in Husserl scholarship (Gary Madison (177-82) and John McCumber (182-85)); and even though "Successors" includes solid choices (Max Scheler, Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, although surprisingly omitting Emmanuel Levinas), one can see that this book has a poorly chosen -- if not misleading -- title. In fact, Detmer spends nine-tenths of the book discussing Husserl. The attention devoted to Husserl's work is not in itself a flaw. Insofar as Husserl is the founder of phenomenology, one could reasonably claim that "Husserl explained" just is "phenomenology explained." Detmer enthusiastically presents the originality and forcefulness of Husserl's phenomenology and skillfully creates concrete examples to illuminate for the first time reader (or teacher) some of phenomenology's more abstract observations.

On balance, however, I don't think these merits can overcome Detmer's rather misleading presentations of core issues and doctrines in (Husserl's) phenomenology. I say misleading because it's not that Detmer's account gets Husserl flat out wrong. Rather, he presents inconsistent accounts of Husserl's thought, and that, I think, could very well confuse or misinform new readers. Moreover, of the 186 pages of his explanation of Husserl, Detmer devotes eighty-two pages to "Early Husserl," i.e., Husserl's Logical Investigations (37-119). Some philosophers may laud Detmer's decision to highlight the essential Husserl, while others might find that Detmer's unbalanced approach suppresses Husserl's more original, transcendental phenomenology. It's important, then, that philosophers from different methodological backgrounds will find Detmer's philosophical style accessible, for instructors who might consider this text for their students should judge for themselves its value based on their interests and objectives.

The introduction to the text exemplifies its strengths and weakness. Detmer takes a promising approach to introducing the spirit of Husserl's phenomenology. He begins with a clear and accessible presentation of Husserl's self-declared radicalism. Radicalism characterizes Husserl's phenomenology, Detmer claims, because phenomenology both presents challenges to traditional forms of thinking in a thorough, comprehensive way and returns to the roots or sources -- the things themselves -- in a presuppositionless way (3). Detmer then provides a unique and instructive explanation of Husserl's characterization of phenomenology as a"rigorous science. He takes an especially interesting heuristic approach (that I believe would be helpful for students new to Husserl) by casting Husserl's ambition in light of the opposition between (i) the subjectivism and relativism of the humanities (including the arts, poetry, songwriting, acting, etc.) and (ii) the objectivism and empiricism of contemporary science that believes that "genuine knowledge is factual in character" (11). As Detmer puts it, "Scientists take these subjects [e.g., of value or culture] to be outside of their purview . . . . Artists address them . . . in an unsystematic and idiosyncratic way, wherein . . . truth and accuracy are usually subordinated [to] . . . personal expression" (10-11). While philosophers have either tended to emulate scientists or artists (say, for example, J. S. Mill or Nietzsche, respectively), Detmer presents Husserl's 'rigorous science' as aiming to balance these dimensions of experience by descriptively accounting for each without reducing one to the other or excluding one from the other. The contrast sets the stage for Detmer's equally neat (crisp and interesting) introduction to phenomenology's interest in, and method for, overcoming bland or naïve objectivism or subjectivism (13-16). This mundane distinction helps orient the novice to phenomenology's 'scientific' mission in a way that does not rely on but sheds light on the distinction between the German language notion of Wissenschaft and the more restricted English language notion of science.

Despite these more promising aspects, Detmer's introduction makes some curious claims. When he introduces (as a subheading in the introduction) the subject matter of phenomenology as that "which investigates neglected subjects of undeniable importance," he identifies consciousness and meaning among topics phenomenology uniquely revives (6, 7). Phenomenology may treat consciousness and meaning in new and illuminating ways, but it's misleading to suggest that the history of philosophy (even in the 19th and into 20th Century western philosophy) overlooked these matters. Detmer, of course, realizes that the important matter is how phenomenology productively innovates on traditional philosophical approaches to these issues. But he overreaches when he contrasts phenomenology to analytic philosophy:

whereas phenomenology studies meaning as a phenomenon, the investigation of which is inseparable from an investigation of consciousness, the analytic tradition bypasses consciousness entirely, and studies meaning almost exclusively in the context of a philosophical analysis of language. (8)

Philosophers writing around Husserl's time took consciousness seriously. Analytical philosophy bypasses not consciousness altogether but various problematic conceptions of consciousness. And while Husserl certainly doesn't reduce consciousness and meaning to the analysis of language, that can be said rightly of all but a few philosophers.

What's more, it's inaccurate to say, as Detmer does of Husserl's view of consciousness, that Husserl "aim[s] . . . to study consciousness . . . from an internal, first-person perspective" (21). Matters become more inconsistent as Detmer immediately notes of this aim that it marks Husserl's "major agreement and disagreement with . . . Descartes" (21). Husserl disagrees, Detmer notes, with Descartes' view of consciousness as a substance -- right -- but he agrees on Detmer's account with the view of consciousness as internal -- wrong. Phenomenology is never an internal enterprise and never restricts itself to the first-personal. Analytical philosophy surely bypasses such Cartesian views of consciousness as something internal -- but so does Husserl, who noted in both his pre-transcendental and transcendental stage that consciousness is not a box or a bag in which one finds ideas, respectively.[1] The misleading inconsistency continues throughout the text as Detmer talks about Husserl's view of consciousness sometimes as a view from the inside, sometimes as a third-way between the poles of dualism, and yet at other times as advancing a view of the "correspondence between [conscious] act and meaning" (23, 147-48, 154). These problematic features perhaps stem from the fact that Detmer does not offer a substantive account of phenomenology's fundamental doctrine of intentionality.

The massive chapter on "Early Husserl" synoptically treats volumes I/II of Husserl's Logical Investigations (the critique of psychologism and the "six investigations"). The chapter includes sound and reliable discussions of central material in Husserl's Logical Investigations, such as meaning, signs and expressions, and parts and wholes. Detmer begins by explaining psychologism in its historical and contemporary context. Concerning the latter, he constructs an extended discussion of Husserl's critique of psychologism and its relevance as a potential challenge to the rising dominance of neuroscience and post-modern relativism. Detmer starts his dialogue between Husserl's prolegomena and post-modernism with Richard Rorty's brand (53-60) and moves into a view of literary theorist Barbara Herrnstein Smith's brand of post-modernism. Detmer casts Smith's work as representative of post-modernism's paradigmatic performative contradiction, which flaw of post-modernism we find anticipated in Husserl's view of the relativism implicit in psychologism: "My theory expresses my standpoint, what is true for me, and need be true for no one else" (61, Logical Investigation 1, § 35). As he transitions from the "Prolegomena" into his synopsis of Husserl's six investigations, Detmer confusingly mentions (especially if we consider Detmer's audience as those new to phenomenology) the notions of bracketing and eidetic reduction'. In his defense, he notes that the former "is fully realized only in subsequent works" (62), but these methodological features apply to the transcendental period of Husserl's writings after the Logical Investigations.

I found more disorienting than these philosophical anachronisms Detmer's appeal to the notions of empty- and fulfilling-intentions as a way to explain Husserl's concept of intuition, for Detmer had yet to explain anything substantive about Husserl's notion of intentionality at this point. A reader new to phenomenology could not be expected to follow the allusion or grasp why or whether Detmer's appeal to empty- and fulfilled-intentions is either right or wrong, helpful or unhelpful when trying to understand Husserl's notion of intuition, which Detmer otherwise straightforwardly notes is "nothing . . . mystical or exotic" but just means "seeing-into . . . [or] something present to us" (68). Nevertheless, he combines the underdeveloped notion of intentionality with an appeal to the notions of the eidetic reduction and (presumably) the epoche (which he mentions only as bracketing in this context) in order to capture the phenomenological notion of meaning:

The procedure of bracketing questions concerning the independent existence of the objects of experience naturally reorients the inquirer toward the question of the meaning of those objects as they are experienced. The investigation of intentionality brings out the point that we experience objects as meaningful . . . The eidetic reduction, in turn, involves a turn toward meaning, as one ignores the irrelevant, contingent aspects of an object, and instead studies essential principles. (71)

As noted above, these remarks don't seem wrong, but they do mislead, for they rely on under-explained or (philosophically) anachronistic concepts. Hence, my sense that if a reader's to make good use of Detmer's account, she must be able to sift through the interesting amidst the misleading.

The much shorter chapter on "Middle Husserl" presents a really nice discussion of how best to understand Husserl's notion of "constitution" (150-52), but two problems plague this chapter. First, one really can begin to see the tensions created by Detmer's chronological presentation of Husserl's thought, which forces him to include in later periods works that would, chronologically, rightly belong in earlier periods. For example, Detmer begins the chapter on "Middle Husserl" with a discussion of Husserl's Lectures on the Phenomenology of Internal-Time Consciousness. Husserl, of course, continued to work on these materials throughout his "middle" period (as far as 1917-1918 with respect to the volume with this title in Husserliana X and the Bernauer Manuscripts of 1917-1918 published as Husserliana XXXIII). But the popularly recognized time-consciousness lectures were given in 1905, very shortly after the Logical Investigations (or "Early Husserl"). And, more substantively, Detmer's decision to cast the developmental stages of Husserl's thought in chronological periods leaves the reader unaware of the role that Husserl's reflections on time-consciousness played in his turn to transcendental phenomenology.

While these matters are less import for new readers, perhaps no matter is more important for the novice's understanding of phenomenology than the central methodological innovations during the "Middle Husserl" or transcendental period, namely, the shift from the natural attitude to the phenomenological attitude by way of the epoche and phenomenological reduction. Detmer misleads when he characterizes the natural attitude as "a barrier to phenomenological investigation" (141). There's a sense in which it is true that the naïve and presumptuous stance toward the world in the natural attitude is a barrier to phenomenological investigation, but that is such a broad sense that the natural attitude would have to be said to be a barrier to any theoretical inquiry (philosophical, psychological, economical, etc.). The natural attitude is not a barrier as something that must be knocked down; phenomenology does not, as Robert Sokolowski notes, wish to invalidate natural attitude intentionalities but clarify them.[2] And if this is true of phenomenology, as I believe it is, then it brings into relief Detmer's omission of a distinction between Husserl's bracketing of the natural attitude (his 'attempts to doubt' the external world) and Descartes' methodological skepticism, which knocks down the barrier of 'common sense' and for which Husserl's reduction is often mistaken.

Detmer's chapters on "Late Husserl" and "Ethics" each span ten pages. The former adumbrates the difference between Husserl's static and genetic phenomenology, as well as the quite notable notion of the life-world. Detmer's account of the life-world sketches with impressive conciseness both its difference from the naturalistic or empirical accounts of experience and its relevance for understanding Husserl's resistance to both realism and idealism (164-65). His discussion does not identify the analysis of the lifeworld as an alternative path to the phenomenological reduction -- an important oversight for those interested in presenting a Husserl who surely isn't just a Cartesian.

The material on "Ethics" is likewise uneven. On the one hand, it presents an approach that may help orient students to Husserl's ethics. Under a discussion of intersubjectivity, Detmer avers, Husserl's "fragmentary" remarks on ethics offer a "solution to" the inability of universalist ethics (under which Detmer includes Kantian deontology, utilitarianism, and virtue theory (171-72)) to respect difference, while obliging everyone to act for the greatest happiness or strive for the listed virtues of a good person. By sensitively attending to the material contexts of life, our personal vocations in conjunction with our moral obligations, Husserl's ethics overcomes a standard ethical dilemma: "we want everyone to be moral. . . . and yet we . . . want to preserve something of the rich diversity of human types . . . that . . . makes life much more interesting than it would be if people were interchangeable with one another" (171-72). Perhaps Detmer's presentation is meant to draw attention to the matter of authentic reason that kept Husserl's interests from the time of his Logical Investigations. He notes, "All of the arguments Husserl presents in his critique of psychologism . . . carry over to the attempt to reduce values to subjective states of liking or approving" (174). These are interesting points of access to Husserl's ethics, which Detmer closes with a paragraph on axiology. But there's no discussion of Husserl's theory of self-responsibility or the vocation of the philosophical life in the self-responsible pursuit of truth (such as one might find in Husserl's Fichte Lectures (1917-18) on the ideal of humanity -- popular, accessible and central for the development of his ethics -- or the more familiar "Vienna Lecture"). And the absence of a discussion of the familiar matters of empathy and inter-subjectivity from the notable fifth section of Husserl's Cartesian Mediations is surprising.

Despite philosophical preferences that incline me to want to appreciate an introduction to phenomenology that is almost exclusively an introduction to Husserl's phenomenology, I don't believe that Detmer's book always explains Husserl's phenomenology very clearly. From the title to the choice of structure onward, it just makes too many misleading claims to justify recommending it to the reader new to phenomenology. But instructors who can wade through the misleading moments of Detmer's account may find some useful heuristic devices for presenting some of phenomenology's mission and method.

[1] E. Husserl, Logical Investigations, Vol. I, trans. J. N. Findlay (New York, Routledge, 2001), Second Investigation, section 23; E. Husserl, On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917), trans. J. Brough (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991), p. 279/289.

[2] R. Sokolowski, Introduction to Phenomenology (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2000), pp. 42-50.