Phenomenology in France: A Philosophical and Theological Introduction

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Steven DeLay, Phenomenology in France: A Philosophical and Theological Introduction, Routledge, 2019, 254pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781138244979.

Reviewed by François Raffoul, Louisiana State University


In this book, Steven DeLay seeks to engage recent developments in French phenomenology. He presents the book as "an introduction to French phenomenology in the post-1945 period," with chapters devoted to Emmanuel Levinas, Michel Henry, Jean-Luc Marion, Jean-Yves Lacoste, Jean-Louis Chretien, and Claude Romano (the reasons for these choices will be clarified below). However, DeLay betrays his actual interest and purpose in the introduction's first line where he laments: that God ("the one of the Bible") "has fallen into disfavor nearly everywhere" (1), that "God's existence is contested rather than presupposed," and that finally, "as a result, it is no longer practiced to philosophize from the fact of Revelation." He also laments Heidegger's choice of a "methodological atheism" to practice phenomenology. The actual purpose of the book is thus not so much to study French phenomenology after 1945 as to explore the possibility of introducing God into phenomenology, intertwining reason and faith, phenomenology and theology, so as to open the way for a theological philosophizing, the author asserting that "there is an essential relation between philosophy and theology" (4).

The work thus develops as an attempt to connect recent French phenomenological works to theology, as if phenomenological insights were to be grasped as theological truths, even though phenomenology understands itself as bound to the phenomena alone and thus in principle rejects any metaphysical or theological constructs. Dominique Janicaud had opened a debate about this "highjacking" of phenomenology by theology in his well-known The Theological Turn of French Phenomenology.[1] DeLay joins that discussion by enthusiastically "doubling down" on this theological bent, making even further explicit the dream of a theological phenomenology where previous authors were more "implicit" about it. The work, in a word, develops as an attempt to introduce God ("the one of the Bible"), after having presupposed God's existence, into philosophical discourse, and in particular into phenomenology itself. This accounts for the particular thinkers DeLay decided to discuss; he chose them precisely because they "do not champion a cozy secularism" (1).

DeLay constantly refers to traditional phenomenology, in which he classifies Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty as atheistic (a tradition he seeks to challenge via this apparently chronological approach) and denying of the existence of God. However, this is not accurate. When Heidegger speaks of a "methodological" atheism, or even when he states that philosophy is in principle atheistic, he does not do so to indicate that it is a matter of affirming or denying the existence of God (that would still be an a priori doctrine imposed on philosophical reflection). He does it, rather, to indicate that philosophy engages in a questioning that is foreign to theology. As Heidegger explains in Introduction to Metaphysics: "For example, anyone for whom the Bible is divine revelation and truth already has the answer to the question 'Why are there beings at all rather than nothing?'" The one who holds on to such a faith, he continues, "cannot authentically question without giving himself up as a believer."[2] There is, as it were, a radical incompatibility between theology and philosophy. Further, phenomenology is not concerned with determining whether there is a divine being or not, but rather with attending to the phenomena as they give themselves to an experience. This is why, to use Janicaud's expression, "phenomenology and theology make two,"[3] a statement that echoes Heidegger's rejection of the mingling of theology with phenomenology, and his famed pronouncement in Introduction to Metaphysics: "A 'Christian philosophy' is a round square and a misunderstanding" (GA 40, 9/8).

This is how Heidegger presents this methodological atheism in a 1921-1922 Winter semester course: "Philosophy, in its radical, self-posing questionability, must be a-theistic as a matter of principle. Precisely on account of its basic intention, philosophy must not presume to possess or determine God."[4] This does not posit an existential atheism, Heidegger clarifying that "my comportment as philosophizing is not religious, even if as a philosopher I can also be a religious person" (GA 61, 197/148). As Ben Vedder explains, "It is widely known that Heidegger takes philosophy to be of atheist character. For Heidegger, this atheism is a methodological axiom rather than the expression of a personal commitment to an atheist view of life. Philosophy, as it were, brackets the question of God."[5] This, in effect, repeats Husserl's reduction of the transcendence of God in Ideas I. In paragraph 58 of Ideas I, titled "The Transcendence of God suspended," Husserl asserts with respect to the absoluteness and transcendence of God: "We naturally extend the phenomenological reduction to this 'absolute' and 'transcendent.' The latter must remain suspended from the new field of research that is to be established, insofar as this field is supposed to be a field of pure consciousness as such."[6] No philosophical -- and even less theological -- position is here taken or defended. Rather, phenomenology attends to the phenomena, remains faithful to the phenomena, lets itself be guided by them, and not by some a priori decision with respect to the existence (or non-existence) of a God.

DeLay devotes a chapter to each of the selected authors, usually following the same format: after a fairly straightforward presentation of the thinker's phenomenological work, he typically concludes by shifting the analyses to the theological realm, attempting to suggest that whatever phenomenological insights were dug out are to be taken as theological truths, as revelatory of the Christian God. In so doing, DeLay leaps from phenomenology to theology, without any transition, offering no justification that could be drawn from the phenomena themselves. Rather, the existence of the biblical God is assumed, then introduced in the phenomena, and finally claimed to have been "found" there (as in the exemplary case of the treatment of so-called "revelation," assumed as the manifestation of God, and then presented as if it were a legitimate phenomenon).

After the introduction, DeLay addresses Levinas' contribution to phenomenology, noting that with his break with Husserlian and Heideggerian phenomenologies, Levinas' rethinking of phenomenology in terms of our responsibility towards others "has laid the primary foundation upon which much of the subsequent work in contemporary French phenomenology has built" (25). DeLay reconstructs Levinas's understanding of ethics as first philosophy, and his ethical reorientation of phenomenology towards the alterity of the other. Near the end of the chapter, the author attempts to suggest that there is a theological scope to these analyses, by way of a series of questions. After having stated that an "analysis of Levinas that neglects the issue of the 'trace of God' would be incomplete" (37), the author articulates the following questions:

Hence we must ask: if the face of the other discloses a transcendence beyond our naturally egocentric attitude, does it not perhaps open up to God? Through revealing our obligation to our 'neighbor,' does not the transcendence of the face also reveal them in the imago dei?

DeLay seeks to understand Levinas' reference to the transcendence and alterity of the other theologically, equating them with the transcendence of God. This seems somewhat forced, for stating that the face of the other exceeds the grasp of the ego does not necessarily amount to positing a transcendent God (unless, as I suggested above, one assumes a priori the existence of such a God and imposes it on the phenomenological analyses). Should all experience of alterity be interpreted theologically? DeLay does not demonstrate its necessity. No justification for such claim is given, it is simply posited. No transition is to be found either when moving from a phenomenological to a theological level. Rather, around the end of a chapter, DeLay suddenly shifts from a phenomenological to a theological discourse, positing a theological frame to Levinas' analyses without any phenomenological justification: with the "call to responsibility," we are said to be "knocking on the doors of grace" (38). With respect to the theme of the face of the other, which is always for Levinas the face of the other human, we read:

Are we not under the gaze of the one true Face, the one of the Savior who, in already having suffered for us, will one day wipe away the tears of those who love Him? In the transcendence of the face are we not met, if only dimly, with the invisible face of Christ? (38-39)

A few lines further, DeLay considers as "dire" the task of "deciding whether the face of our visible human neighbor bears the invisible trace of Christ" (39). The text thus proceeds dogmatically, far from any phenomenological demonstration.

In the chapter on Marion, in the context of a phenomenological discussion of finitude, of excess and lack, DeLay muses: "When for instance delighting in the peace of God's love shed abroad in our hearts, is not an absence (and hence a corresponding hope) at work?" (94). And when faced with a saturated phenomenon, DeLay still wonders: "are we not always left yearning for an even fuller encounter" (95), the saturated phenomena revealing, "in unmistakable fashion, an excess awaiting complete fulfilment in a world to come, one prepared for everyone who loves devotedly the truth in this one" (95). As we can see, DeLay translates phenomenology into a theological language, once again without any transition or justification in the phenomena themselves. Later, when speaking of beauty, DeLay determines that the beauty of "the things of the earth and heavens" are not the origin of the "beauty they exhibit." He then adds: "Something shines through them. Their beauty manifests the fact that they are not the origin of themselves, nor the beauty to which they give voice. They point to their Creator" (139). How can one simply assume in such a way the existence of a creator of the world? Is that a claim that has been phenomenologically drawn, attested? As we can see, we are quite far from phenomenology. DeLay simply leaps out of phenomenology into the theological realm, without any argument, justification, or phenomenological demonstration. In a word, he theologizes phenomenology, and in so doing betrays phenomenology's vow of faithfulness to the phenomena.

With respect to an alleged theological nature of Levinas' discourse, one should note that Levinas has always insisted on the strictly phenomenological status of his discourse, even when he uses vocabulary drawn from the religious tradition. For instance:

The terminology I use sounds religious: I speak of the uniqueness of the I on the basis of a chosenness that it would be difficult for it to escape, for it constitutes it; of a debt of the I, older than any loan. This way of approaching an idea by asserting the concreteness of a situation in which it originally assumes meaning seems to me essential to phenomenology. It is presupposed in everything I have said.[7]

Even the absolute of which Levinas speaks, i.e., the absoluteness of the other, is to be taken in its phenomenological sense: "The absolute -- an abusive word -- could probably take place concretely and have meaning only in the phenomenology, or in the rupture of the phenomenology, to which the face of the other gives rise" (Entre Nous, 167, my emphasis). The religious vocabulary is given a phenomenological status in Levinas's work. This in fact is confirmed by Levinas when he speaks of the Bible as a "pre-philosophical experience,"[8] that is, as a text that can lend itself to a philosophical and phenomenological appropriation. The otherness of the other is described phenomenologically by Levinas, and does not presume some theological beyond, unless one wants to posit it dogmatically. The same situation applies to Michel Henry, also considered by DeLay as contributing to this dream of a theological phenomenology. In "Christianity: A Phenomenological Approach?", Henry clearly states his intent: "I would like to investigate the possibility of a phenomenological approach to Christianity," which he considers in terms of the phenomenology of life he develops. Henry claims that ultimately Christianity "becomes intelligible in a radical phenomenology of life -- inasmuch as life is revealed in this very phenomenology, due to its radical nature."[9] It is therefore not phenomenology that must be given a dogmatic, theological content, but rather theology that must be appropriated phenomenologically!

As we have noted, DeLay engages French phenomenology after 1945 (at least a few selected representatives of that movement) in order to pursue a theological interest. He does not begin with the phenomena, but with the question of God; he does not let himself be guided by the phenomena, but by a theological interest, which he seeks to introduce into phenomenology. As we can see, DeLay does not proceed without some major presuppositions or assumptions, a paradox considering that phenomenology has sought to define itself since Husserl as a discipline that refuses metaphysical or theological a prioris in the task of letting itself be guided by the phenomena alone. His approach is ultimately not phenomenological but theological. As such, this work cannot constitute a reliable guide to French phenomenology, or to phenomenology in general. Nonetheless, notwithstanding the issues I raised above, the book is a well-written and provocative work, which makes for a lively reading and which gives much to think.

[1] Dominique Janicaud. Phenomenology and the "Theological Turn": The French Debate, ed. Dominique Janicaud (NY: Fordham University Press, 2000).

[2] Martin Heidegger, Einführung in die Metaphysik, ed. Petra Jaeger (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1983), GA 40, pp. 8-9. Introduction to Metaphysics, trans. Gregory Fried and Richard Polt (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2000), pp. 7-8.

[3] Dominique Janicaud. Phenomenology and the "Theological Turn": The French Debate, p. 99.

[4] Martin Heidegger, Phänomenologische Interpretationen zu Aristoteles. Einführung in die phänomenologische Forschung, ed. Walter Bröcker and Käte Bröcker-Oltmanns (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 2nd edn, 1994), GA 61, p. 197. Phenomenological Interpretations of Aristotle, Initiation into Phenomenological Research, trans. Richard Rojcewicz (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001), p. 148.

[5] Ben Vedder. "Heidegger's Atheism: The Refusal of a Theological Voice," Ars Disputandi, 3:1, 137-138.

[6] Edmund Husserl. Ideas for a Pure Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy, trans. Daniel O. Dahlstrom (Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett, 2014), p. 107.

[7] Emmanuel Levinas. Entre Nous: On Thinking-of-the-Other. Translated by Michael B. Smith and Barbara Harshav (New York: Columbia University Press, 2000), p. 227.

[8] Emmanuel Levinas, Ethics and Infinity: Conversations with Philippe Nemo. Translated by Richard A. Cohen. Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1985), p. 24.

[9] Michel Henry. "Christianity. A Phenomenological Approach?", in Journal of French and Francophone Philosophy - Revue de la philosophie française et de langue française, Vol XXVI, No 2 (2018), p.99.