Phenomenology in French Philosophy: Early Encounters

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Christian Dupont, Phenomenology in French Philosophy: Early Encounters, Springer, 2014, 338pp, $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400746404.

Reviewed by Edward Baring, Drew University


The French reception of German phenomenology was the result of one of the most consequential border crossings in modern intellectual history. In the interwar period, the work of Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, and to a lesser extent Max Scheler began to find traction west of the Rhine, where it proved to be a critical stimulus to philosophical renewal. Consequently, German phenomenology shaped the work of some of the most recognizable figures of twentieth-century French thought. The dynamics of this reception has attracted the interest of numerous intellectual historians and philosophers over the past fifteen years, and a vibrant field of scholarly inquiry has emerged. Christian Dupont's book is the latest instantiation of, and a precursor to, this literature. Published earlier this year in the prestigious Phaenomenologica series, it is a lightly modified version of Dupont's 1997 dissertation, which has been an important reference for almost all the other scholars working on the topic.

Dupont's book is a clear and readable account of a complex moment, and can serve as an introduction to French philosophy more generally in the first half of the twentieth century. It provides accessible surveys of the work of a number of important thinkers within and outside of the phenomenological tradition, including Henri Bergson, Léon Brunschvicg, Maurice Blondel, Édouard Le Roy and Lev Shestov, as well as a host of less well known figures. The sheer scope of Dupont's research commands respect, and he shows great facility analyzing a large variety of philosophical traditions. The book will thus be an aid for scholars, and it is written so that readers can dip in and read individual sections depending on their interest. A number of abstracts and synopses throughout allow readers to orient themselves with ease.

The French reception of phenomenology is, of course, a huge topic, and Dupont begins his discussion by staking out his territory. First, he focuses almost entirely on the reception of Husserl, discussing Scheler and Heidegger only when that is necessary for the task (10). He also restricts himself temporally, stopping in 1939. These boundaries delimit the topic of the book, but a further boundary divides it down the middle. Dupont distinguishes (in his terms) "French philosophy" from "French religious thought," and treats them separately.

This structure reflects Dupont's major claim: the two receptions of phenomenology were "distinct," and proceeded independently of each other. Both were, Dupont argues, marked by the thought of Bergson and Blondel, but they diverged in the way they understood Husserl's relationship to Descartes. As Dupont suggests,

In the case of French philosophers, their interest in phenomenology was encouraged by the interpretation of phenomenology as a continuation of the Cartesian tradition, that is, as an attempt to secure the foundations of science and logic through reflection upon consciousness. The interest of French religious thinkers, on the other hand, was incited largely by the desire to break from the strict rationalism that Cartesianism represented among French academic philosophers. (5)

As the book develops, Dupont expands upon this claim: he identifies both Aristotelian and Cartesian elements in Husserl's phenomenology and suggests that French religious thinkers concentrated on the former, while secular thinkers focused on the latter (296). The French Husserl was thus cleaved in two, with each half following a different trajectory.

Two chapters are dedicated to the "precursors" of phenomenology. It is a guiding principle of the book that there is "no reception without receptivity" (7), and consequently Dupont scans pre-War French thought for suggestive parallels with phenomenology that might explain why it found such fertile ground there. In a helpful if somewhat schematic account of late nineteenth century French philosophy, Dupont homes in on the impact of Bergson and Blondel. Far more than the positivism, idealism, or spiritualism, which ruled the roost in the period, it was the innovations of these two thinkers, according to Dupont, that made phenomenology recognizable and attractive in the French context. Dupont singles out for comment those aspects of their work that approached Husserl's intuition, a "descriptive inventory of the contents of consciousness," which preceded and perhaps undermined the pretensions of the positivistic sciences (15).

Dupont undertakes a similar analysis at the beginning of the second part of the book, examining the work of Le Roy and Pierre Rousselot, who helped promote Bergsonian and Blondelian themes in French theological circles. Le Roy wanted a return to a primitive intuition, a "method of immanence" that reaches beyond the constructions of science to get at the "original intuitive sources of knowledge" (179). Rousselot tried to move beyond simple "rational thinking" to get to the intellect, direct intuitive knowledge, which according to him was at the heart of Aquinas's thought (191). What was distinctive in these cases, however, was that they figured intuition in a way that pointed towards the divine, and thus they provided a model of thinking through the ways in which phenomenology could be applied to religious questions.

These two chapters on phenomenological precursors set up the main analyses of the book. In chapter three, Dupont tells the relatively familiar story of the reception of phenomenology in mainstream French philosophy between 1910 and 1939. He starts with the work of the Belgian neo-scholastic Léon Noël and Sorbonne philosopher Victor Delbos. Both identified Husserl's criticism of psychologism in the first volume of the Logical Investigations as the most important aspect of his work. More extensive treatments of Husserl's phenomenology would have to wait until the 1920s, and the debate between Lev Shestov and Jean Hering over Husserl's rationalism. Shestov considered Husserl an unrepentant rationalist, tying philosophy too closely to science, and thus excluding the irrational elements of reality. Hering defended Husserl from this criticism, arguing that he promoted intuition above reason (114). Set alongside the more general and accessible introductions by Bernard Groethuysen and Georges Gurvitch from the end of that decade, these debates presented French philosophers with a fuller and sympathetic picture of phenomenology. The burgeoning interest in phenomenology was a crucial factor in Husserl's 1929 invitation to Paris, where he gave lectures at the Sorbonne (later published as the Cartesian Meditations). Husserl's lectures foregrounded the association between his work and Descartes's, and this directs Dupont's attention in the final part of the chapter: an analysis of Levinas's and Sartre's reading of Husserl.

Chapter five forms the heart of the book, and will be of most interest to scholars of phenomenology. Dupont examines here the religious reception of Husserlian phenomenology in France, reading in turn the liberal Protestant Hering, the Catholic Apologist Gaston Rabeau, and Thomists as diverse as Joseph Maréchal and Jacques Maritain. Dupont provides illuminating and rich accounts of the various receptions, giving us a flavor of the debates, arguments, and anxieties that accompanied the reading of Husserlian phenomenology by theologians and religious thinkers.

Dupont’s book is an impressively researched contribution to the literature, providing fine-grained readings of a range of texts. It falters, however, when it tries to draw broader conclusions. The boundary fences that Dupont erects to mark out his subject, in particular that between "French philosophy" and "French religious thought," cause problems when they are made to do double duty as a thesis. In placing too much confidence in such boundaries, Dupont tends to over-estimate both the homogeneity of the thought within and the differences across them.

The assumption of homogeneity within the various boundaries motivates the chapters on phenomenological precursors, for it is only by showing parallel developments in France, Dupont suggests, that we can understand how phenomenology took root there. Dupont identifies some interesting convergences between Husserl and Blondel, Bergson, Rousselot, and Le Roy, but is often less successful in showing that these figures did in fact lay the groundwork for the reception of phenomenology. Indeed, even the relationship to Bergson, which has been long recognized by scholars as a central factor in early readings of Husserl, is, as Dupont admits, attested by remarkably little textual evidence (54, 94-5). The impact of the other figures is even less clear. The connections Dupont finds between the work of Hering or Rabeau and Le Roy (e.g. 221, 228, 244) for instance are often quite thin or speculative, and the connection drops out completely in discussions of neo-Thomists like Maritain (296).

Further, it is not clear that the sharp division between religious and secular thought that structures Dupont's account is really reflective of the messy world of French philosophy, and to his credit, Dupont follows his evidence even when it challenges his main argument. Hering after all appears in both halves of the book, first as a "French philosopher" and then as a "French religious thinker." One of the major figures of the early "philosophical" reception of Husserl was the Thomist Noël, who trained some of the figures on the other side, such as René Kremer, and whose work provided the occasion for Maritain's treatment of Husserl in The Degrees of Knowledge. Indeed though discussing it as a form of religious thought, Dupont admits that Thomists engaged with phenomenology primarily "as a philosophy rather than as a theology" (297). The same is true for the claim about the Descartes/Aristotle split. In the French philosophy section of the book, Descartes does not emerge as a central player until the last section treating Levinas and Sartre, and even then, Levinas explicitly rejected the Cartesian priority of the subject, which Dupont interprets as a sign of his proximity to the "Aristotelian" Blondel (86). Meanwhile for many religious thinkers, such as Daniel Feuling and Maritain, Husserl's close affinity with Descartes was the defining feature of his thought (285, 300).

Borders are important precisely where divisions are not secure. In such situations, they are less descriptions of neatly ordered states of affairs than the recognition that order has to be imposed. For this reason, what is valuable about Dupont's book is not the sharp lines that inform its argument, but the rich research that refuses to be contained within them. For this is a book about how ideas cross borders, and it is only appropriate that the borders that Dupont erects himself should show themselves to be equally permeable.