Phenomenology of Illness

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Havi Carel, Phenomenology of Illness, Oxford University Press, 2016, 248 pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199669651.

Reviewed by Luca Vanzago, University of Pavia, Italy


The book deals, as the title explicitly states, with the phenomenology of illness. The main aim is to analyze illness as something whose experience is a universal and substantial part of human existence. At the start, Carel claims that illness, like death, raises important philosophical issues. But unlike death, illness, and in particular the experience of being ill, has received little philosophical attention.

The reason for this neglect might reside in the fact that illness is often understood as a physiological process that falls within the domain of medical science, and is thus outside the purview of philosophy. But Carel suggests that the experience of illness has been wrongly neglected by philosophers in general, philosophers of science and of medicine in particular, and by biomedical theory and practice. This philosophical and biomedical neglect stands in stark contrast to the intense interest in this experience from the general public and from ill people and those who care for and about them.

Carel's strategy thus is complex. On the one hand, she intends to deepen the experience of illness, seen as something irreducible to the objective treatment of disease (a term adopted to denote physiological dysfunction) by medical science. On the other hand, Carel claims that this approach does not constitute a disavowal of medical practice, but an important integration of it. The book even provides what Carel calls a "phenomenological toolkit" aimed at improving the treatment of patients by providing them with a framework through which to understand their experiences, both from their own perspective and from the physician's.

Carel considers it necessary to supplement a naturalistic account of disease with a philosophical study of the experience of illness (how the disease is experienced) itself. This approach therefore aims to study illness without viewing it exclusively as a subject of scientific investigation. Carel claims that it is not enough to see illness as an entity in the world that can be studied with the tools of science. Illness also has to be studied as a lived experience. To study the lived experience of illness is necessarily to explore its existential, ethical, and social dimensions.

Furthermore, Carel maintains that the aim of the book is twofold: to contribute to the understanding of illness through the use of philosophy, and to demonstrate the importance of illness for philosophy. This bilateral approach lies at the heart of the book. It argues that a philosophical analysis is essential to developing a full understanding of illness, and complements work in medical anthropology, sociology of health and illness, health psychology, and qualitative health research

We can see then the wide scope of this work. Carel unfolds an articulated discussion of the theme, starting from an explanation of the reasons to use phenomenology in order to study illness (chapter 1), then discussing the phenomenological features of the body (chapter 2), and in particular the body in illness (chapter 3), and illness as an instance of "bodily doubt" (chapter 4). There follows a chapter on the phenomenology of breathlessness (chapter 5). The book continues with chapter 6 on the question of whether well-being is possible during illness. It then discusses the relations between illness and death (chapter 7). Chapter 8 turns to an important issue, concerning what is called "epistemic injustice" in healthcare, and finally chapter 9 addresses the philosophical role of illness.

Since it's obviously not possible to discuss each chapter in detail, I will focus on some specifically philosophical aspects of the book. In particular, I intend to examine the claim that illness constitutes an invitation to philosophize. I will also discuss the methodological role that Carel ascribes to illness, comparing it to the phenomenological method of epoché, and for good reasons. Finally, I will address some remarks to the relationship between a phenomenological approach to subjective experience in general, and the experience of illness in particular, and the objective methodology of natural sciences, that is, the distinction made by Carel between illness and disease, and the phenomenological grounds allowing such a distinction.

Unlike death, which has notoriously prompted renowned and celebrated discussions, illness has so far attracted scarce interest in philosophy. Carel insists on this, remarking that the invitation illness issues to reflect on one's life can be readily resisted. Many people, both healthy and ill, deny, flee, or otherwise resist thinking about vulnerability, morbidity, and mortality. This reaction, Carel adds, stems from the difficult nature of illness:

unwelcome and demanding, it extends its bony fingers to grab, restrict, and sometimes destroy all that we hold dear: freedom, motility, agency, action, possibility, and the openness of the future. Perhaps philosophers' neglect of illness is one sort of such denial, or an attempted falsification (in the Nietzschean sense) of the realities of life through willful, although often unconscious, blindness to its uglier faces. Contra the philosophical tendency to resist thinking about illness, I propose that illness is a philosophical tool. Through its pathologizing effect illness distances the ill person from taken-for-granted routines and habits and thus reveals aspects of human existence that normally go unnoticed (p. 5).

Developing a systematic understanding of illness as a philosophical tool is thus a primary task the book sets for itself. It seeks to clarify and elaborate the philosophical value and usefulness of illness and to explore the ways in which philosophy may make use of illness. As Carel remarks, this, too, is something philosophers have not, with few exceptions, engaged in previously. But if we turn to sciences such as neurology or developmental psychology, we find that illness, or pathology more generally, has many established uses. For example, the study of the effects of brain injury can help us understand the normal function of a brain region.

Viewing illness as a subcategory of pathology and using it in an analogous way to understand the normal structure of human experience has much to offer philosophy. What we have, therefore, is a bilateral flow from philosophy to illness and back. Philosophy, and in particular phenomenology, can be used to understand the experience of illness, and illness can be used to shed new light on central areas of philosophy such as ethics, political philosophy, and the study of human experience. The idea that the illumination is mutual is a central theme of this book. The book itself aims primarily to illuminate illness through the use of philosophical concepts, frameworks, and methods. But it also suggests that illness ought to be studied seriously by philosophers because it has a distinctive contribution to make to philosophical work in various areas; hence Carel's proposal to adopt a phenomenological approach.

This might raise questions on the part of the natural scientist who thinks that phenomenology is not scientific. Yet the problem lies precisely in how to promote an interaction between objective science and subjective analysis of experience, in the firm belief of the possibility and indeed the necessity of such dialogue. I personally share Carel's belief. Yet I think that her approach is in need of some development in order to promote such dialogue.

Carel's method is based on the claim that the personal and anecdotal levels of experience are essential to this kind of philosophical work and are indeed what motivates it. Furthermore, Carel maintains that the personal suffering and personal growth which are respectively afflicted and afforded by illness cannot be abstracted from the particular context of an individual life and the idiosyncratic way in which illness is lived by a particular person.

Obviously, Carel is aware that this approach, grounded on first-person reports and stories, is a challenge to some understandings of philosophy as an abstract and general reflection, or indeed as the formulation of universal rules to aid our understanding (e.g. logic) or guide our behaviour (e.g. ethics). Of course different types of philosophical work require different levels of abstraction. She is not suggesting that all of philosophy ought to proceed by the existential-phenomenological method employed in the book. However, Carel strongly insists that the practice of philosophy and the drive to philosophize are rooted in subjective, personal experience and can be characterized as an attempt to distinguish the idiosyncratic from the shared aspects of such experience.

Carel's concept of the philosophical enterprise is thus influenced by a particular version of the phenomenological approach:

Phenomenology -- or at least the kind of existential phenomenology employed here -- is a process of improving our understanding of both general and concrete aspects of human experience" (p. 6). The phenomenological approach adopted in the book is further qualified as drawing mostly from Husserl's, Heidegger's, Sartre's and Merleau-Ponty's works. Illness is "a breakdown of meaning in the ill person's life. Because of the disruption of habits, expectations, and abilities, meaning structures are destabilized and in extreme cases the overall coherence of one's life is destroyed  (p. 14).

To speak of meaning structures, however, does not mean to focus on consciousness or in any case on disembodied mind. On the contrary, it is the body that represents the focus of the whole inquiry, and this focus enables Carel, as well as anyone willing to promote a dialogue between sciences and humanities, to suggest this kind of approach as more fruitful than the usual objective one. Moreover, in this light illness can be seen not only as devastation, but also as "an opportunity to examine the ill person's life. It can be used to explore an individual life, its meaning, goals, and values and how best to modify them in response to illness" (p. 15).

This hope cannot be met while remaining within the limits of objective medicine, for according to Carel, modern medicine is characterized by a focus on biological dysfunction, its causes, and treatment, and by increasing reliance on medical technology for prevention, diagnosis, and treatment. The medical world-view dominant in contemporary Western societies is scientific and relies heavily on understanding discrete mechanisms and functions in a detailed, if piecemeal, fashion. It is also highly, and increasingly, specialized.

Carel admits that modern medicine has been extremely successful in, for example, understanding and controlling the causes of infectious disease. Breaking the physiological body down to subsystems and functions and studying these discretely has yielded incredible results in understanding cell proliferation processes (e.g. cancer) and understanding how body systems and organs function and how to intervene in useful ways when function is replaced by sub- or dysfunction. Modern medicine has made great advances in the last 150 years or so, in understanding what causes disease and what may ameliorate or prevent it.

Yet Carel thinks that this is not sufficient. She claims that, viewed from a subjective or everyday perspective, the experience of illness is the more important element of the disease-illness coupling. We care about physiological dysfunction primarily when it causes us pain or discomfort, or prevents us from doing certain things, although of course merely knowing about a disease status or risk is enough to cause us stress and anxiety. Our contact with disease is through our experience of it, be that direct (experiencing symptoms) or indirect (learning about one's genetic risk factors).

Carel suggests that this disruption is phenomenologically central because it allows us to examine the changed embodiment, uncanniness, bodily alienation, and bodily doubt that characterize it. She further claims that rather than seeing illness as secondary to disease, we ought to view it as a primary set of phenomena. If we add to these two claims a further claim -- that illness is a fundamental experience in almost everyone's life -- we can appreciate the importance of understanding how illness affects one's life, how it changes experience, and how it shapes the life of the ill person, ultimately forming what Merleau-Ponty calls a 'complete way of being'.

Illness thus appears to be not only a problem which concerns every human being, potentially or actually, but also a challenge that invites us to philosophize, for it takes place, whether one likes it or not, and therefore requires in any case an answer. Here lies, in my opinion, the force of Carel's contribution. It might be put otherwise, in more technical terms, by speaking of phenomenological epoché and reduction. This is something not every reader might be familiar with, so it may require a brief explanation.

Carel states that:

Illness also provides an opportunity for reflection by performing a kind of suspension (epoché) of previously held beliefs, including tacit beliefs. These characteristics warrant a philosophical role for illness" (p. 11). In chapter 9 she provides a fuller explanation of this suggestion. There Carel shows that "illness calls upon the ill person to explore her life, its meaning, priorities, and values. This personal quest is well documented in sociology of medicine, medical anthropology, qualitative healthcare research, and cancer psychology. But illness is also a distinctively philosophical tool motivating reflection, by moving beyond the idiosyncratic and personal to a general and abstract exploration of embodiment as a source of meaning and condition of possibility for the self. In particular, the anxiety, loss of meaning, and defamiliarization described in the previous section give rise to a peculiar form of what Husserl termed the epoché, a suspension of our 'natural attitude' (pp. 214-215).

Thus, what in Husserl seems to be a detached and abstract performance of a disengaged philosopher, fully shows its real potentiality when seen from the perspective of illness. Undoubtedly, here Carel gives a Heideggerian twist to this notion:

The epoché asks us to dislodge ourselves from everyday habits and routines in order to reflect on them. This, I suggest, is what happens in illness, albeit in a raw and unformulated manner. Illness is a particular form of philosophical motivation forced upon the ill person and characterized by violence and negativity. The epoché asks us to shift our focus from objects to acts of perception, but does not involve ceasing to perceive; it is not a skeptical procedure. It is a shift in one's way of being in the world that enables philosophical reflection without ceasing to be part of the world. Exercising the epoché involves stripping away shared meanings and familiar connections between person and object. The object then becomes freed from tacit and accepted modes of perceiving and understanding it, and appears in novel ways. Thus the experience of illness, or anxiety, as a particular type of epoché can shed new light on taken-for-granted aspects of the world (p. 215).

This is certainly a remarkable interpretation of the epoché; but, my agreement with it notwithstanding, I think that something more is required in order to further the dialogue between medicine and philosophy. I believe in particular in the need to deepen the nexus between bodily experience and bodily life, along the lines suggested by Merleau-Ponty in his lectures on nature at the Collège de France in the mid-Fifties. Otherwise we risk remaining on the level of consciousness, no matter how embodied this is. This issue is receiving increasing attention, especially, but not only, among phenomenology-inspired thinkers. Here we should at the very least mention Renaud Barbaras and Leonard Lawlor, as well as the very important earlier work of Hans Jonas, in particular his book, The Phenomenon of Life. There Jonas shows that a renovated biology might still be accepted by scientists while allowing us to integrate these philosophical concerns. Jonas also outlines a proposal for an ethics for living subjects that is attentive to the challenges posed by contemporary bio-technology.

Many other themes are included in this important book, which could not be discussed here. Its overall aim makes it in any case worth reading with critical attention.