Phenomenology of Sociality: Discovering the 'We'

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Thomas Szanto and Dermot Moran (eds.), Phenomenology of Sociality: Discovering the 'We', Routledge, 2016, 337pp., $148.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138918795.

Reviewed by Hans Bernhard Schmid, University of Vienna


Phenomenology was big at the beginning of the 20th century, but it started to lose its leading role to other strands and movements of philosophical research in the second half -- resulting not just in a change of methods and styles, but also in a change of topics. Over the past few decades, however, one after another of the classical phenomenological research topics have reappeared on the philosophical agenda -- starting with intentionality and consciousness, current "phenomenological" issues extend to such topics as social cognition and emotion, collective intentionality, joint action, group agency, and social ontology. These issues, however, are often explored without reference to -- or perhaps sometimes even knowledge of -- the rich phenomenological tradition. As a particularly crass (but local) symptom, this neglect of the phenomenological tradition and the independent recent rediscovery of its research topics have even left a mark on current German language use: with the recent interest in the structure and role of empathy in the international discourse, the neologism "Empathie" has seen an astonishing career in current German. "Empathie" is an appropriation of the English word "empathy". According to the OED, however, "empathy" is a neologism specifically coined at the beginning of the 20th century to translate the German "Einfühlung", a core term in (though not a creation of) phenomenological philosophy.

Yet there is a bright side to every gap or lacuna: the recently increased interest in old phenomenological topics opened up an opportunity for philosophers specialized in the phenomenological tradition, who were quick to advertise their area of specialization as systematically relevant to the current debates. A number of contributions of this sort have appeared over the last decade. Thomas Szanto's and Dermot Moran's volume is the latest contribution to this line of work.

This volume gathers 19 contributions, all of which connect insights from the phenomenological movement (very broadly conceived) with issues of current debate in the abovementioned research areas of philosophical analysis. All chapters are original work. Each strikes a different balance between interpretation and systematic analysis. On the one end of the spectrum are contributions that are largely interpretive in character -- yet the foci of interpretation are chosen with an eye on what might be valuable as a systematic position on the topic. On the other end of the spectrum are contributions that are systematic in their approach, leaving the historical references to the footnotes. Yet these contributions testify particularly vividly to the persistent vitality of phenomenological philosophy in a wide variety of research fields.

The collection has five parts, each with three to four chapters. Part I, "Historical and Methodological Issues", opens with a very short paper by James Risser, who focuses on the notion of shared life. He takes the reader a step beyond the phenomenological movement, narrowly defined, by siding with Hans-Georg Gadamer against Karl Löwith and Martin Heidegger, arguing for a view in which "the Thou is a focal point" (32). In the second chapter, Sophie Loidolt focuses on yet another author who -- though widely recognized as important -- is not usually considered a phenomenologist. The topic is Hannah Arendt's concept of plurality -- roughly the idea that that human life is lived together with others. Loidolt reconstructs Arendt's view in contrast to what the author calls "standard interpretations". The standard view that is rejected takes plurality as something that "simply factually exists" (43), while Arendt's existentialist analysis of the human existence is shown to be emphasizing the active character of living together. A "paradoxical plurality of unique beings" (47), Arendt claims, is a core feature of this activity. While the activist aspect of plurality is of Aristotelian origin, the paradoxical character of this conception bears distinctly Husserlian marks.

Richard Wolin examines Jürgen Habermas' use of the concept of Lebenswelt as taken from phenomenological sociology. Lebenswelt is identified as Habermas' way of doing justice to the insights of the hermeneutical tradition, while making up for its alleged "rationality deficits". However, Wolin ends with a critical assessment: given "the historical variegatedness of individual life-worlds", he states, "one cannot help but wonder whether Habermas places more methodological weight on the lifeworld ideal than it can in point of fact bear" (67).

In "Second-Person Phenomenology", Steven Crowell provides a "phenomenological reflection on the experience of being addressed by a claim, experiencing oneself 'in the accusative'" (70). Second-person phenomenology is phenomenology because it is "reflection on first-person experience". The experience of oneself "in the accusative", Crowell argues, is "constitutive for fundamental concepts such as responsibility, accountability, self-identity, and rationality". This theme is developed from Husserl through Sartre to Lévinas, and there is some criticism of authors who, independently of the phenomenological tradition, have recently come up with a closely related view (especially Stephen Darwall).

Part II is titled "Intersubjectivity, the 'We-World', and Objectivity". In the opening chapter, Jo-Jo Koo addresses the question of whether concrete encounters with others or the experiential sharing of a common world is more fundamental for human co-existence. Early Sartre, Buber, Theunissen, and Levinas are depicted as advancing the former view. Koo, however, sides with the smaller camp of opponents, especially with early Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, according to whom co-existence in a common world is primary.

Dermot Moran picks up on the fascinating wealth of Husserlian reflections, especially in Husserl's research manuscripts, on how to bring the mondadological conception of the first person perspective -- a point of view from which "other subjects" appear simultaneously as analogous to oneself, and yet as radically alien -- together with the phenomena of familiarity, sharing, togetherness, and common ground, where we experience each other neither as "analogous" to ourselves nor as "totally alien". "Ineinandersein" (being within each other) is chosen as the key term. Moran follows this thread deeply into the work of Merleau-Ponty, arguing for a genuinely intersubjectivist conception of transcendental subjectivity.

In an extremely interesting paper, Cathal O'Madagain develops what he calls a "Husserl-Davidson-Argument" for the social origin of our concept of objectivity. Objectivity in the sense of "recognized independence from me" requires the experience of actual perspectives which I do not have, and this is where Husserl provides a phenomenological premise that, according to O'Madagain, is missing in Davidson's account. This is a very challenging paper that indeed brings phenomenology into a fruitful dialogue with more recent debates. (Follow-up questions that a skeptical reader might have include if the particular sense of objectivity O'Madagain has in mind really fits that of Husserl, who seems to understand the particular kind of objectivity that requires intersubjectivity as "being there not just for me" rather than as "being there independent from me".)

In the first chapter of Part III, Joona Taipale finally taps into the rich phenomenological resources on empathy -- a topic which the reader might have expected to come up, and that remains at the center of interest in several of the subsequent papers. Focusing on Alfred Schütz, Taipale argues that empathy sets out as type-oriented (experiencing others as representative of groups of people) and develops into a token-oriented experience subsequently (experiencing others in their singularity). Felipe León decidedly drives the phenomenology of experiential sharing further by engaging with interactionist approaches to shared cognition. Havi Carel draws on a wide variety of phenomenologists to tackle the issue of what she calls the "breakdown of empathy in illness". It is argued here that "the social experience of illness can be accounted for by the growing distance between the ill person´s bodily experiences and those of her healthy counterparts" (179).

Christian Skirke takes the phenomenology of empathy in yet another new and promising direction. Against the usual and perhaps more intuitive view, reflected in much of the phenomenological literature, that empathy is more basic than -- and indeed a condition of -- the experience of shame, Skirke picks up on Sartrean leads in arguing that empathy and shame are in fact two faces of the very same coin, as it were, concluding that "shame and empathy are structurally isomorphic and therefore equiprimordial as intentional experiences of others" (194). With Matthew Ratcliffe's contribution, the topic shifts from a self-directed to an other-directed emotion. Ratcliffe argues vehemently against a simplistic belief-desire model of grief, exploring grief as "a way of relating to the dead, the living, and the social world" (212). The paper concludes with the thought-provoking suggestion that grief is a "second-personal experience of death", a form of experiential relation to others that no account of social cognition with any ambition to completeness should ignore.

Part IV is titled "Collective Intentionality and Affectivity". Íngrid Vendrell Ferran opens with a brilliant interpretation of one of the most promising resources the phenomenological tradition has to offer to current social ontology: Max Scheler's taxonomy of "sympathy phenomena", together with Scheler's obviously correlated taxonomy of types of sociality. Forms of sociality such as community and association correspond to particular ways of feeling with or for others; this is indeed, as Vendrell Ferran claims, a starting point for a "New Phenomenological Sociology".

In "Love and other Social Stances in Early Phenomenology", Alessandro Salice unearths insights from a lesser-known phenomenologist, Dietrich von Hildebrand. Salice's considerations revolve around the problem of reciprocation -- what sort of uptake is needed for such phenomena, or, to put it more crudely: is it really love if the beloved person does not love you back? Salice also compares Hildebrand's view to Adolf Reinach's proto-speech-act theory. Eric Chelstrom advertises Aaron Gurwitsch's work. Like Scheler (and in accordance with the sociological literature of his time), Gurwitsch distinguishes between different forms of sociality, and he has views on what forms of sociality involve what type of emotional rapport between the participants. Of particular interest are Gurwitsch's comments on the affective nature of trust. Chelstrom argues that current collective intentionality analysis could learn from these insights (one might perhaps argue that to some degree at least, it already has, but Chelstrom is certainly right with regard to the early "classics" of the literature on collective intentionality). Joel Krueger discusses the proposal made by several phenomenologists in early 20th century and in the recent literature that there is a "strong sense of shared emotions: the idea that a numerically single emotion can be given to more than one subject". Krueger discusses this idea in the context of current psychological research as well as the philosophical literature, which "render the idea more plausible than might initially appear" (273).

Part V is on "Collective Agency and Group Personhood". Emanuele Caminada opens with an investigation into Husserl's remarks on groupings, plural intentional subjects, and "higher-order personalities". Caminada makes the important point that in the emerging view, joint intentional attitudes should not be conceived of as presupposing social units; rather, the respective social units should be seen as a feature of the dynamics of the sharing of intentional attitudes itself. Szanto evaluates Scheler's concept of the "total person" (Gesamtperson) in the context of current accounts of corporate and group persons. With good reasons, he finds some advantages in the Schelerian view, especially in connection with Scheler's taxonomical structure, and in connection to the role assigned to values in Scheler's account. The chapter also identifies problems with this account, having to do with the question of individual intentional autonomy of the members of collective persons. Szanto concludes that Scheler's analysis can "serve as one of the most instructive philosophical case studies on how intricate the relation between the autonomy of individuals, the integrity of group persons, and the threat of collectivism ultimately is" (309).

The concluding contribution is by Nicholas de Warren. It provides a reading of some core features of what is perhaps the most underrated contribution to social ontology, Jean-Paul Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason. De Warren does an excellent job in making some categories of this unnecessarily voluminous and really badly edited Sartrean text accessible. He follows the Sartrean dialectics of forms of sociality from the "group-in-fusion" through the "pledge group" to the "statutory group", where it all ends up in terror: "evil must be destroyed" (325) -- worthy final words for this ambitious collection indeed!

Surveying the entire volume reveals an enormous diversity of perspectives, with some of them converging on the same peak from rather opposing directions. Is Gadamer right against the phenomenologists he criticizes (chapter 1)? Has Habermas a point when he avails himself to a piece of phenomenology for the purpose of criticizing Gadamer for his conservatism (chapter 3)? To be sure, there is no either-or here, but these are very different suggestions indeed concerning the role and importance of the phenomenological tradition. This volume is thus a rather adventurous and truly inspiring journey through a wide variety of topics and views, with just enough salient landmarks (especially, of course, Edmund Husserl) never to lose one's orientation along the many ways. In their introduction, the editors make a heroic attempt to identify further cohesion, but perhaps a bit less would have been more here. Given the diversity of the phenomenological movement, it is perhaps not the best idea to try to summarize what "phenomenologists have argued for" in a series of three bullet points (7f.). Any attempt to reduce the complexity of the phenomenological movement in order to introduce it into the current discussion as "a unified position" comes at heavy costs.

To give just one example, the editors boldly (and indeed a bit harshly) claim that "it is entirely wrong to conceive of phenomenology as practicing any form of methodological individualism, let alone solipsism" (2). This backfires rather heavily: As far as methodological individualism is concerned, this verdict coldly excommunicates such leading social phenomenologists as Tomoo Otaka and Schütz (the latter of which is contained in the collection), who followed Max Weber in endorsing methodological individualism. As far as methodological solipsism is concerned, it deserves to be remembered that Rudolf Carnap introduced this term with explicit reference to Husserl's "epoché". In this sense, Husserl is even the very paradigm of methodological solipsism -- but Husserl is not, as it is claimed in the intro (3), the person who first coined the term social ontology (L.P. Massip claims to have coined the term in his Doctrine républicaine, ou Principes naturels et économiques d'ontologie sociale from 1871, and to my knowledge, the credit goes to him -- though perhaps a check with Google's Ngram viewer in a couple of more languages should come before making a statement).

Rather than to stipulate some unified phenomenological position and trying to police some identity of the phenomenological discourse, a more promising way of advertising the topic of this valuable collection to current research is to point out that we find some of the same controversies we're having today (e.g., with respect to the question of whether and how collective intentionality can be reduced to individual intentionality) already within the phenomenological tradition. This volume contributes greatly to this line of research.