Phenomenology of Thinking: Philosophical Investigations into the Character of Cognitive Experiences

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Thiemo Breyer and Christopher Gutland (eds.), Phenomenology of Thinking: Philosophical Investigations into the Character of Cognitive Experiences, Routledge, 2016, 224pp., $148.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138901704.

Reviewed by John J. Drummond, Fordham University


The debate concerning cognitive phenomenology in analytic philosophy of mind has centered around, first, the question of whether we consciously experience cognitive states. If one answers affirmatively, a second question arises: do cognitive states have phenomenal character in their own right, independent of the phenomenality proper to any associated or incorporated states? If so, a third question concerns the nature of cognition's phenomenal character.

The editors state that the purpose of the book is "to broaden the scope of this debate by fostering dialogue between the philosophy of mind and the phenomenological tradition inaugurated by Edmund Husserl" (1). For thinkers in the phenomenological tradition, however, the phrase "phenomenology of thinking" evokes not merely the cognitive phenomenology debate but also the broader description of acts of thinking so as to identify the essential structures requisite for an experience to be an instance of thinking at all. Identifying such structures might have implications for characterizing the phenomenal character of thinking, but it does not do so in a manner that directly addresses the questions posed above. Hence, broadening the scope is achieved both by a direct engagement of the cognitive phenomenology debate by philosophers indebted in greater or lesser degrees to the phenomenological tradition and by attempts to disclose what essentially characterizes the experience of thinking in general. Since the thinkers represented in this volume believe that there is a cognitive phenomenology proper to cognition, they devote their work largely to the issues of irreducibility, the phenomenal character of thinking (or, rather, types of thinking), and the broader discussion of the nature of thinking.

Without suggesting that the authors of the papers address only one of these interconnected questions, we can group the papers -- at least to some extent -- in terms of them. For example, the contributions of Marta Jorba and Maxime Doyon are primarily discussions of whether there is a cognitive phenomenology. Jorba advances two independent, but related, theses: (1) cognitive attitudes have a specific phenomenal character or, as she calls it, an "attitudinal cognitive phenomenology" and (2) there is an element in cognitive experiences, namely the horizon of possibilities, that provides further evidence for a cognitive phenomenology (77). She defends the first thesis by arguing that a subject S can (introspectively) differentiate her entertaining that p from her wondering whether, doubting, hoping for that p, and so forth. But this would be impossible if the phenomenal character of such experiences did not differ (81). The second thesis is justified by an appeal to the fact that experiences are embedded in a holistic experience of the world wherein previous experience, knowledge acquisition, and dispositional beliefs play a role. These form a background, which varies from subject to subject, such that, say, one's entertaining that p makes available certain inferences or ways of extending one's experience in different directions (86-7). This background knowledge is consciously (and implicitly) experienced by the subject as possibilities for further thinking. The relation of the horizon of possibilities to the notion of cognitive attitudes arises from the fact that this horizon affords different kinds of possibilities from those afforded by sense-experience or emotions (91).

Doyon claims that each intentional change involves a phenomenal change, and that this establishes that each type of experience, including thinking, has a phenomenal character. By reflecting on the intentional content of thinking, Doyon seeks to determine whether thinking has unique intentional features that make up the phenomenal character of thinking. Following Heidegger, Doyon notes that perception possesses an as-structure comprising both "a semantic dimension, which corresponds to the as-structure of statements, assertions, predication, and, more generally, conceptual thinking." But there is another, more fundamental dimension: "a pragmatic dimension . . . that discloses worldly objects in their significance for us at the pre-predicative level of experience, so before any judgment or thematic statements can be made about them" (120-21). Contra Hubert Dreyfus, Doyon argues that familiar objects involved in our absorbed coping do appear as such, with their as-structure, and that the object does not first appear as such when it passes from Zuhandensein to Vorhandensein; it only changes its mode of presence. In a manner both comparable to and different from Heidegger, Husserl investigates the grounding of acts of thinking -- specifically, the recognition of things as of a type -- in pre-reflective and pre-linguistic origins necessarily involving a pre-cognition of the typical. The passage from pre-cognition to cognition of the type marks the emergence of the distinctive phenomenal character of cognition (125).

Two papers focus primarily on the issue of irreducibility and, in so doing, point to a clarification of the nature of the phenomenal character of cognition. Elijah Chudnoff considers moral perception. He contrasts the cases where A and B, sitting on a train, see a woman carrying heavy grocery bags and unable to find a seat. Both perceive the woman's discomfort, but only B sees that she should offer her seat to the woman (209). Since B's sensory states are the same as A's, the difference between A's and B's phenomenal states cannot be attributable to them. B's overall experience differs insofar as it contains a moral insight, and by virtue of this insight Chudnoff characterizes moral perception as a low-level intuition of an abstract claim and its truth-maker (212). B is aware, in other words, of the abstract principle that there is a prima facie duty of beneficence to relieve the discomfort of the woman, and she is perceptually aware of the truth-maker that she is in a position to do so (216). Hence, Chudnoff concludes, the phenomenal character of moral perception is irreducible.

Walter Hopp supplements arguments for irreducibility from contrast with an argument from comparison to show that there is phenomenal content independent of sensory or intuitive content. (Hopp uses "intuitive" differently from Chudnoff for whom intuitions are directed to abstract objects.) Hopp appeals to the distinction between full (intuitive) and empty (non-intuitive) intentions and notes one can both look at a blue house and think of the blue house apart from seeing it. The former is an intuitive experience, whereas the latter is non-intuitive (empty). Hopp compares different overall experiences with the same empty content ('blue house'), i.e., what one can intend emptily, and varies the intuitive or sensory content of the experiences (visual, auditory, imaginative, etc.) (49ff.) that can be associated with the empty content. Since the empty content remains constant in the variation of the overall experiences having different intuitive content, there must be a non-intuitive in each of the experiences, and this constitutes the phenomenal -- or, as Hopp prefers, phenomenological -- character of (emptily) thinking. Hopp extends the argument even to perception, since perception too includes empty moments without which I cannot be said to perceive an object. Intuitive contents, in other words, cannot by themselves account for the phenomenal character even of perception (56-7).

Three papers focus more or less exclusively on the question about the nature of the phenomenal character of cognition. Uriah Kriegel, for example, concentrates his discussion on judging that p because one might legitimately think that making a judgment is the -- or, at the least, a -- prototype of cognition (29). Kriegel identifies twenty-three surface features of judging. He suggests that these "platitudes" could serve as the basis of a properly structured, sophisticated Ramsey-sentence that would "be the best publicly available characterization of the phenomenology of making a judgment" (40). The sentence would be the disjunction of a series of conjunctions whose conjuncts are subsets of however many platitudes can be identified. The disjuncts would range from the conjunction of those features most common among judgments -- and would, therefore, be included in most of the disjuncts comprising the sentence -- to the disjunct conjoining the least common features -- and, therefore, included in the fewest disjuncts in the sentence (40).

David Woodruff Smith starts from the question of whether the particularity of an individual -- its 'this-ness' -- can be given in experience and, more specifically, whether such givenness can extend beyond sensory experience to merely thinking about an individual in the absence of perception. He applies his modal model of self-consciousness to this problem. Twin-scenarios pose a challenge for the phenomenal character of 'this.' Smith responds to the challenge by arguing that from a first-person perspective I have an "exploding" experience: "I directly experience a changing presentation of this individual, 'she,' this same individual, is experienced first as 'Deanna' and then as 'Donna'" (72). The same individual is experienced even as I change my mind about the personal identity of 'this' individual. Hence, Smith concludes that the form of phenomenally thinking about a particular individual is: "Phenomenally (in this very experience I now here think that . . . this individual is . . . )" (75).

Anders Nes proposes that the phenomenal character of conscious inference is best understood in terms of Grice's notion of natural meaning (97). When I consciously infer q from p, I take it that p "means that" q; it need not be the case that this inference involves a self-awareness of my inferring that q, but there is nevertheless a "connecting thought" (101) that joins p and q and that constitutes the inference's phenomenal content. The "means that" is an instance of Gricean natural meaning (as opposed to non-natural meaning such as linguistic meaning) and expresses this connecting thought (105).

Three papers focus on the broader sense of a phenomenology of thinking. Shaun Gallagher's discussion is situated in the context of the McDowell-Dreyfus debate. Dreyfus views our actions and embodied coping with the world as "mindless" and fully non-conceptual (135-36), whereas McDowell argues that our actions have a structure that is "rational and amenable to conceptuality" (137, 139). Gallagher seeks to split the difference when he claims,

Our ability for making sense out of the world comes, in part [Gallagher's emphasis], from an active and pragmatic engagement with the world. If we can then turn around and discover that our world or our experience has an inherent rational or proto-conceptual structure, that is because that structure has already been put there [my emphasis] by our pre-predicative embodied engagements. (139)

The last clause points back in the direction of Dreyfus, although Dreyfus would not view this as a kind of rationality. Gallagher stresses, however, that we cannot think of this embodied pragmatic rationality (or any rationality, for that matter) simply in mental terms; it involves the body in myriad ways (gesture, spoken and written language) and insofar as it embodied, it necessarily involves other subjects. All rationality is embodied, intersubjective rationality.

Rudolf Bernet notes the importance both of a conceptual analysis of our experience and of exploring new forms of conceptual thinking and their limits. He roots his discussion in the Heideggerian and Deleuzian discussion of a non-representational and non-subjective thinking that is before (logical) thinking, a "dynamic mode of thinking that cannot be ascribed to an autonomous subject asking questions and finding solutions. It is the insistence and urgency of questions that bring about thinking and thinkers -- not the other way around" (159). At least in the case of Deleuze, however, this thinking remains conceptual but not logicist. He recaptures a way of thinking conceptually that "concentrates on the mystery of an unthought and the leaves room for alternative ways of thinking" (163).

Dieter Lohmar examines non-linguistic thinking and communication. Non-linguistic thinking includes phenomena such as daydreaming, while non-linguistic communication is what Lohmar calls "the hands & feet system of communication" (165), which utilizes gesture, pantomime, and onomatopoeia. Daydreams are not simply phantasies; more importantly, they represent to us our longings, hopes, aspirations, fears, and so forth, and they provide a way of working out solutions to problems. From an evolutionary point of view, daydreaming is an older and more original form of thinking that continues its work in the present (170-72). Regarding communication, the hands & feet system of communication relies on a similarity-semantics. We communicate through imitative gestures, actions, and sounds (175-76).

Finally, Steven Crowell's contribution explicitly addresses all three questions mentioned at the beginning of the review. Crowell focuses his attention on the experience of truth: noting that something is true. He uses the example of a "hunch" that he has left his glasses on the desk when leaving for work. Returning to the desk, he sees the glasses and recognizes that his hunch was correct. It is not merely that seeing the glasses on the desk in fact confirms the hunch; it is that seeing the glasses on the desk is noted as confirming the hunch. The thought that posits the possibility that the glasses are on the desk includes an understanding of what the world must be like if its propositional content is true (185). The perception of the glasses on the desk can be confirming only if it is taken as laden with the same meaning as is present in the thought. Noting the truth of the hunch is to recognize the coincidence of the thought as understood and the perception as meaning-laden (188). This recognition requires that the meaning of my thought and my noticing the coincidence are phenomenally conscious (190). Moreover, this recognition is possible only insofar as the domain of meaning has been entered, and it depends on factors that cannot be reduced to sensory states, images, or emotions. Crowell then asks how it is that I can be aware of meaning; what kind of thinking must occur for meaning to show up at all. Since the meaning of the thought has a normative structure, the experience of truth is available only to beings "sensitive to normative distinctions" (196). Crowell here turns to Heideggerian conscience and to Heidegger's 1951/52 lecture course Was Heißt Denken?, with its discussion of the relation of noein and legein, to characterize the kind of "thinking" (as opposed to other cognitive experiences such as judging, believing, or willing) that constitutes such sensitivity to normative distinctions: the taking over being a ground (201).

It is impossible to do justice to the complexities of these papers. Suffice it to say that they are invariably interesting and thought-provoking. Taken together, they present a set of ideas that will advance the understanding of cognitive phenomenology from a phenomenological perspective, and they have implications for the debate as conducted in analytic philosophy of mind. The papers all assume the existence of cognitive phenomenology and present compatible approaches to addressing the irreducibility issue, but there is a wide variety and divergence in the discussions of the phenomenal character of thinking. There is no single, discernible, emergent "phenomenological view of thinking." This is not a criticism. The book makes an important contribution in presenting these divergent views. They motivate further thought (with its phenomenal character, whatever it might be) on the nature of thinking itself.