Phenomenology: Responses and Developments

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Leonard Lawlor (ed.), Phenomenology: Responses and Developments, 320pp., vol. 4 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 vols.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226740461.

Reviewed by Lester Embree, Florida Atlantic University


This is the pivotal volume in an impressive eight-volume historical work. The previous three volumes interestingly extend "Continental Philosophy" back to Kant, and the subsequent four volumes describe new developments up into the present. I am especially interested in how this fourth volume largely confirms my contention of a decade ago, namely that Continental Philosophy is composed of an ever-growing set of tendencies that merely share (a) an initial struggle with Husserlian Phenomenology and (b) an interaction with others that began that same way.[1] (It is unfortunate that Nenon's fine chapter on Husserl is in the previous volume.) After some remarks on the Introduction and eleven chapters, I will turn to a broader discussion of the so-called "Analytical" and "Continental" Philosophies and their alleged "divide."


In the Introduction, the volume editor, Leonard Lawlor, makes the preliminary case that the forms of Continental Philosophy in most of the twentieth century not only react to Husserl but also seek to be concrete and can be considered, broadly speaking, existential. In addition to existentialism in particular, the volume treats themes of Hegelianism, aesthetics, hermeneutics, and religion, and a chapter on the Philosophy of the Concept shows the way on to structuralism and later positions.

In Chapter 1, John Russon discusses the Hegelianizing of French Phenomenology. The teaching of Alexandre Kojève affected Lacan, Weil, and Merleau-Ponty directly, but Beauvoir and Sartre also studied the Phenomenology of Spirit. On the connection with Marxism, it is nice to see Trân Duc Thao remembered. Hyppolite's Logic and Existence shows that Hegel's Science of Logic needed study as well and connected to phenomenological concerns with ontology. "The generation of French thinkers that followed this period, however, seem in many cases to have accepted a 'received' Hegel, which carries on the misrepresentations and inadequacies of these earlier Hegel interpreters as much as it carries on their insights" (40).

Chapter 2, by S.K. Keltner and Samuel J. Julian, is devoted to existentialism, which continued in France through the 1970s despite the rise of Derrida, Deleuze, and Foucault. Beauvoir is treated on a par with Merleau-Ponty and Sartre, as is Levinas, whose parallels with Sartre are noted. Marxism and politics were involved off and on. The footnotes document the many American translations as well as studies, which makes one wonder if there have been any American existentialists. There is a nice appendix on Spanish existentialism, but it should be noted that the leading Spanish scholars today instead consider Ortega a phenomenologist following Husserl and Heidegger.

Chapter 3 on Sartre is by William McBride, the best for the task. He traces Sartre's continuing struggle with Husserl, and fully appreciates Beauvoir's help. He also treatsBeing and Nothingness concisely and clearly and shows the influence of Husserl and, to a lesser extent, that of Heidegger. McBride's detailed history of this work's reception was impressive news to me. Volume I of Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason appeared in 1960, but was largely eclipsed by Althusser, Foucault, and Derrida and has yet to be fully appreciated. The Notebooks for an Ethics from 1945 published in 1983 also deserves more study. The aged and blind Sartre was asked if he ever left phenomenology and replied, "Never. I continue to think in those terms. I never thought as a Marxist, not even in the Critique de la raison dialectique" (84).

Galen Johnson is a fine choice for Chapter 4 on Continental Aesthetics. Aesthetics is a secondary sub-discipline of philosophy for some, but it is central in Continental Philosophy, even though hardly a unified field. Johnson presents phenomenological and anti-phenomenological positions and interestingly characterizes Continental philosophy simply as philosophy not written originally in English. Heidegger's "Origin of the Artwork" and Merleau-Ponty's "Eye and Mind" are central, but there also are Sartre, Ingarden, and Dufrenne. The anti-aesthetics of Levinas disapproves substituting image for object and holds that "There is something wicked and egoistic and cowardly in artistic enjoyment. There are times when one can be ashamed of it, as of feasting during a plague" (101). Gadamer is concerned with the quasi-religious and the irreligious in play, symbol, and festival. Curiously, phenomenology for Adorno and Benjamin is allegedly unable to recognize how perception is affected by history and society. And then postmodernism begins with Foucault.

In "Merleau-Ponty at the Limits of Phenomenology," Chapter 5, Mauro Carbone discusses Merleau-Ponty's opposition to the Cartesianism of disincarnated vision. His work is presented as moving through three stages. The first is the most Husserlian, distinguishing three impacts of his thought on Merleau-Ponty and making the role of the body clear. The second stage draws on the phonology of de Saussure, and the third moves toward a not-culminated (because of the philosopher's early death) nondualistic ontology of flesh.

In Chapter 6, on the hermeneutical transformation of phenomenology, Daniel Tate offers a good exposition of the new hermeneutics in Being and Time and of Gadamer'sTruth and Method, rightly said to represent a "linguistic turn" in phenomenology, which elsewhere focuses on perception. "Effective history" (or the history of influence) is well appreciated and "pre-judgments" are posited as central conditions for understanding and for the human sciences in Gadamer. The chapter covers responses to him by Betti, Habermas, Ricoeur, and Derrida, but unfortunately not that of the Husserlian Seebohm, who works from traditional hermeneutics.

The Later Heidegger is a difficult story well told in Chapter 7 by Dennis Schmidt, but seems to me underappreciated by Continental work beyond the Heideggerian tendency. The movement beyond Being and Time begins in the 1930s, but becomes clear after the war and is expressed in short essays. The movement has three foci: (1) "technology is regarded in terms that also characterize metaphysics; namely, the increasing subjectivization, rationalization, calculability, explicability, consolidation, and uniformity of the world" (160); (2) abstract art already plays a large role (but here there is a need for more scholarship on his posthumous works); and (3) language, particularly the poetry of Hölderlin, continues to be of great importance.

Chapter 8, on Existential Theology, is the least satisfactory. Andreas Grossman treats many figures and discusses some of their interrelations, but the chapter as a whole seems artificially assembled. It is difficult to understand how what is presented here could be studied as a specialty within Continental Philosophy. Various atheists are mentioned, but atheism is not recognized as a theological position. The figures touched on are Stein, Maritain, Mounier, Buber, Marcel, Heidegger, Bultman, and Tillich. The newly edited Heidegger-Bultman letters are promising for further scholarship

In Chapter 9, on Religion and Ethics, Felix Ó Murchadha covers religion much better than Chapter 8 does. After World War I, Kierkegaard was finally appreciated and then also Barth, Rosenzweig, and Otto (not covered in this chapter). There was a revitalization of Catholicism, Protestantism, and Judaism after science and politics had dominated, and eventually there was a "theological turn" in France. The chapter includes miracles, revelation, sin, and, with Marcel, incarnation. Levinas is presented as well.

In Chapter 10, on the Philosophy of the Concept, Pierre Cassou-Noguès shows how French philosophers moved beyond the existentialism of the central three decades of the twentieth century. This movement is traced back to the war and to Cavaillès's On Logic and the Theory of Science, the title Canguilhem gave it. These two figures along with Foucault represent three stages by which "the Philosophy of the Concept," an expression already in Cavaillès, comes to replace the philosophy of the subject. "Against phenomenology, such a structuralism would claim that there are structures independent of the subject and that they determine our subjectivity" (230). "For Foucault . . . the philosophy of the concept becomes the philosophy of knowledge . . . in opposition to a philosophy that finds its foundations in the description of our immediate experience" (234).

In the last chapter, Dermot Moran discusses relations between Analytical and Continental philosophy. Early on there was considerable interaction with phenomenology from Russell, Moore, Ryle, Carnap, etc. But after the war, only Apel, Habermas, and Ricoeur considered Wittgenstein, Austin, Searle, etc., while Anglophone analytical philosophers paid no attention to phenomenology and what followed. Only at the end of the 1970s did thinkers such as Rorty do so. Challenges to phenomenology began in Europe with the neo-Kantians, but Heidegger also learned from neo-Thomism. Then soon after the war the Frankfurt School challenged Heidegger about his fascism and metaphysics.

Moran focuses on four analytical challenges to phenomenology: (1) that of the Viennese positivists, especially Schlick; (2) that of Carnap to Husserl and Heidegger; (3) that of Wittgenstein and Ryle to Heidegger and Husserl; and (4) that of Searle in his debate with Derrida over Austin. No doubt because of my ignorance about Analysis, I learned the most from this chapter, but I am not as optimistic as Moran seems to be about the coherence of the so-called Analytical and Continental philosophies and their reconcilability.


I now, as promised, turn to a broader discussion of the Continental/Analytical "divide". There has been much silly talk about the names of "Continental" and "Analytical", particularly the complaint that the first is a geographical term and the other methodological. But if we pay attention to ordinary language, we see that names come from many sources, e.g., "Smith" from an occupation and "Freud" from a mental state. Johnson's point, noted above, about the original languages in which the philosophers being distinguished wrote is more interesting, if only because it leads to questions of culture.

In the article cited in note 1, I claimed to have determined the current signification of the adjective "Continental" when, seeing Adorno classified as a phenomenologist, I realized that another rubric than "Phenomenology and Existentialism" was needed for the tendencies that kept coming from Europe. This led the decision in 1976 of the Center for Advanced Research in Phenomenology to name our new series at Ohio University Press the "Series in Continental Thought" ("thought" to include work from disciplines beyond philosophy, these tendencies being highly appreciative of the human or cultural disciplines). Friends tell me that the expression was already in use and I cannot say that it was not "in the air," but I have yet to see earlier documentation.

Besides recognizing where the new tendencies were coming from, let me suggest that naming from within the set of interconnected tendencies should have priority over naming from outside. Out of respect for the first usage in a 1945 anthology I prefer the original British form, "Analytical," but perhaps there is an earlier expression of that as well.

Coincidentally, the ultimate chapter by Dermot Moran here answers a question I had not thought to ask, namely that of when Continental and Analytical Philosophies, which had enjoyed significant interaction previously, separated: "the Second World War seemed to have had a decisive impact and, in the postwar years, the two traditions grew apart and developed separately from one another, leading to a kind of détente, although one based largely on mutual ignorance" (236).

Alan Shrift writes in his general Preface to all the volumes of this history that:

In this and the accompanying seven volumes in this series, "continental philosophy" will be understood historically as a tradition that has its roots in several different ways of approaching and responding to Immanuel Kant's critical philosophy, a tradition that takes its definitive form at the beginning of the twentieth century as the phenomenological tradition, with its modern roots in the work of Edmund Husserl (vii).

Obviously I agree with the second part of this statement, but as to the first part, I was disappointed to see no recognition of how, even though there was some interaction with and terminological borrowings from Neo-Kantianism, phenomenology (as opposed to most other Continental tendencies) has its past chiefly not in Kant or Hegel, but in Locke, Berkeley, Hume (especially), Mill, and even William James. For them and for phenomenology, the mental is not "transcendentally deduced," but reflectively observed and described in general as well as particular terms. Thus, Husserl, his teacher Brentano, and others from the last stage of the Dual Monarchy differ from Berlin and the Prussians. Phenomenology (and Psychoanalysis) grew, although differently, from the same soil as the Vienna Circle, Logical Empiricism, and Wittgenstein.

As to twentieth century Continental Philosophy, to which this fourth volume is devoted, it appears to me as something not only having little conceptual coherence, but also actually amounting to a tacit political coalition of ever more tendencies coming from mainland Europe. I myself belong to what can be called the American Husserlian tendency, and I was initially disappointed that this volume had no explicit discussion of Husserlians such as Gurwitsch, Schutz, Seebohm, and Sokolowski. I was also disappointed that it didn't recognize that this tendency has strongly continued into the twenty-first century, where it often seems a position against which non-phenomenological tendencies still define themselves within what classically preserves its original name as the "Society for Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy" (SPEP).

But then I read with pleasure in the Preface the very nice "institutional history of continental philosophy in the United States" (x-xi) with its recognition of refugees including Gurwitsch and Schutz, John Wild's role at Northwestern University, the Northwestern University Press book series, and the initial two opposing tendencies led by Wild and Gurwitsch in the founding (and dual name) of SPEP. Except that the name change to "Continental Philosophy" did not come until over a decade later, this is indeed just how it all started and where it grew from.

I thus have some insider familiarity with American Continental Philosophy and have also observed the imitation of it in the UK, where major publishers such as Blackwell and Oxford have produced large volumes that probably sold mostly on this side of the pond. But what about Analytical Philosophy? Here I am rather ignorant. I studied with Husserlians at the New School in the 1960s, then during three years at Northern Illinois University I heard of "Michigan style" Conceptual Analysis (whatever that is), and next spent most of two decades at Duquesne University among Husserlians and Heideggerians. I had not even heard of "philosophy of mind" until 1990 when I found it in the description of a position I interviewed for! So I am unusual in an era when most Continentals are minorities if not singletons in Analytical departments and to get along have to understand alien thought (and have often not been understood in return).

One can then wonder not only how Continentals find positions and get tenure at all, but also how SPEP has grown to be the second largest professional philosophical organization -- after the American Philosophical Association -- in just half a century. A popular explanation among Continentals is that in a free market of undergraduate electives, Analysis is too boring while Continental courses raise enrollment numbers. Then again, there are "good Analysts" who do not like to feel exclusionary (especially now that Continentals can no longer be ignored) and maybe some of them are even intellectually curious.

In any case, I now hesitate to do more than ask questions about Analytical Philosophy. Thus, why be bothered by the so-called divide? Have there not always been competing schools of thought in all forms of high culture, science and philosophy included? Who believes that philosophy is or ever was one coherent discipline? Perhaps the bridge builders wish to become part of the larger group, as the excluded often do, but they certainly do not like hearing that they should expect only one-way traffic.

Then again, assuming that Continental Philosophy is fundamentally a political alliance, could the same not be the case for Analysis? Somewhere Thomas Kuhn says that there are schools of thought within theoretical physics and suggests that the empirical limit of how many productive others one can keep up with is under 100. How many thousand Analysts are there in the USA? To be sure, if Analysis is also an alliance of tendencies, it is a much tighter one and differently focused than on major figures such as Continentals tend to cluster about. One can even wonder about the extent to which "Analytical Philosophy" is much more than the ideology of a dominant group.

Continental Philosophy tends more to appreciate the cultural sciences and thus culture, including history (which is to be expected from its anti-positivism), and it is thus easy for me to make a comparison with ethnicity in America. If the many tendencies easily distinguished within Continental Philosophy are like the Peoples of Color, then Analysis is like White America -- better called "European American" -- which is an idealization and resists having its Dutch, German, English, Scottish, etc. components distinguished. Also in this cultural perspective, there is a question of the dominance of secularly Protestant institutions and how Continental Philosophy has been better received in Catholic institutions.

Then again, it seems that while Analysts train deeply in logic and argumentation, Continentals must know languages and appreciate translating much more, considering translation and even editing to be forms of research. Analysts have interestingly started doing history of their tendencies (Do I rightly remember that a Russell Circle has been formed?) and some consider this to be decadence in contrast with the ascendance of Continental Philosophy and SPEP. But Continentals, especially Hermeneutic Phenomenologists, have been if anything too much involved in the history of philosophy. Continental readers of this review might be surprised to hear that I complain about too much energy being devoted to the interpretation of all the texts that keep coming from Europe (100 volumes coming of Heidegger, already 40 of Husserl, etc.) and assert that we do not do anywhere near enough original philosophy in the Continental tendencies we are committed to (but I try!).

In short, it is to be wished that somebody with the knowledge and courage of a Brian Leiter would tease out what might well prove to be scores of tendencies within the huge political coalition called Analytical Philosophy in North America. Is Pittsburgh Analysis different from Analysis at Berkeley, at Princeton, at Harvard, etc.? Devolution here would be very interesting.

A final observation: The Analysts are proud of the clarity of their expression and no doubt the Continental styles are different, e.g., Husserl's style is practically Gothic, which no doubt discourages many lazy Continentals to get beyond simplistic stereotypes, but at least he is no longer attacked for disembodied intellectualistic solipsism, as he was by some Existentialists in the 1950s and '60s! But to consider cultural things again, there is an arrogance at least of those who believe they alone speak the proper version of a language, are then intolerant of minority and regional dialectics, and demand others to speak like them or not be heard.

When I and some Continental friends sit in the back of presentations at the APA, it usually sounds like English, but many words have slightly shifted significations that the speakers seem unaware of. I expect technical terminology in all serious work, but hopefully not a technical dialect. An Analyst visiting the Husserl Circle, much less SPEP, might have the same experience. It is not a new observation that two peoples can be divided by an allegedly shared language.

To conclude, I want to emphasize that this and, judging by the tables of contents, the whole set of eight volumes, is a rather solid work and well worth reading in. I especially learned new things about Existentialism, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, and Hermeneutics. But one should begin with this Volume 4 and then consider what happened in the Continental coalition that got started in the USA after World War II and grew as Americans began studying again in Europe as they had not done in significant numbers since the 1920s; and, again, there is the influence on phenomenology of British Empiricism that needs to be recognized.

[1] Lester Embree, "Husserl as Trunk of the American Continental Tree," International Journal of Philosophical Studies, Vol. 11 (2), 2002, 177-190. The founding editor of this journal tells me that this continues to be its most downloaded article.