Philosophers Explore The Matrix

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Christoper Grau (ed.), Philosophers Explore The Matrix, Oxford University Press, 2005, 341pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195181077.

Reviewed by Allan Hazlett, Texas Tech University


By the end of 1999, when nearly every undergraduate-aged American had seen The Matrix, philosophy professors rejoiced -- here was a deceptive virtual reality scenario burned into our collective cinematic imagination. No more explaining how the evil demon causes my sensory experience, no more explaining how the scientists built the experience machine, now we could just say: "It's like in The Matrix." Several volumes have emerged since the film was released offering discussions of the philosophical issues that arise out of the film (and its sequels), but Grau's collection is by far the best.

However, as in the film, 1999 is now in the past. Our naturally short attention span combined with two atrocious sequels have greatly diminished the popularity of The Matrix. Its reputation as a subtle, suggestive, and intellegent sci-fi masterpiece has been marred by the fact that everyone can tell that the dialogue in Reloaded and Revolutions is pseudo-profound nonsense designed to intimidate the audience into thinking that something deep is going on. (See, for example, TBS's hilarious re-editing of Neo's conversation with the Oracle in their commercials for airings of Reloaded.) In 2000 every undergraduate had seen The Matrix; today most haven't. The demand for a philosophy class devoted to the film, which existed then, no longer exists today. It is unfortunate that Philosophers Explore The Matrix came out this year, instead of five years ago (the result, I'm told, of some legal mess or other), though the essays that comprise it have happily been available at, Warner Brother's Matrix website, for years, and are to this day.

The book will be of interest, I imagine, to two groups. First, fans of the film with an interest in philosophy should without hesitation procure a copy -- Grau's collection features leading contemporary philosophers discussing some of the most exciting issues in philosophy, at a level accessible to any intelligent non-philosopher, and (in some cases) the arguments are exciting, original, and state of the art. (These sections would be of interest to professional philosophers with an interest in the film or in science fiction in general.)

Second, the book could be used as a text for an introductory level course -- a screening of The Matrix followed by examination of the philosophical issues it raises. My discussion of the book will proceed, then, under the assumption that the intended readers are either introductory-level philosophy students or non-philosophers with an interest in philosophy.

Apart from Grau's introduction and an introductory chapter noting connections between The Matrix and Descartes' Meditations and Nozick's "Experience Machine," the book consists of chapters on metaphysics (by Tim Mawson, David Chalmers, Colin McGinn, Andy Clark, and John Partridge), freedom, ethics, and value theory (by James Pryor, Hubert and Stephen Dreyfus, Iakovos Vasiliou, Julia Driver, and Michael McKenna), the philosophy of religion (by Richard Hanley, and Rachel Wagner and Frances Flannery-Dailey), and a brief (and bizarre) chapter by robotics researcher Kevin Warwick. The volume also includes selections from Plato, Descartes, Berkeley, Nozick, and Putnam -- an admirable inclusion, as these included texts are discussed at length in the other chapters.

There are two excellent chapters in the book by Chalmers and Hanley -- the best two chapters, in my opinion -- and I want to discuss each briefly. This will, I hope, give a taste for the best of what Grau's volume has to offer.

Chalmers' contribution, "The Matrix as Metaphysics," is an insightful and well-argued defense of the view, defended previously by Putnam in Reason, Truth, and History and (in a somewhat different form) by Bowusma in "Descartes' Evil Genius," that most of the ordinary beliefs of the envatted people in The Matrix would be true. What is distinctive of the envatted people in The Matrix, Chalmers argues, is that the following three claims are true of them:

(1) Their minds are not part of spacetime.

(2) The spacetime they inhabit is fundamentally computational.

(3) The spacetime they inhabit was created by beings outside of that spacetime.

None of these (either alone or in conjunction with the others) entails that most of said people's beliefs are false. Dualists believe (1), some physicists believe (2), most theists believe (3). Would a theistic dualist who believed what some physicists believe be forced to admit that most of her ordinary beliefs were false? No. Therefore, Chalmers argues, neither should we think that the envatted people in The Matrix have mostly false beliefs.

But if the envattment scenario depicted in The Matrix is not one in which the envatted people's beliefs are mostly false, then it isn't a "skeptical hypothesis," i.e. "a hypothesis that I cannot rule out, and one that would falsify most of my beliefs if it were true." (p. 134) This certainly is the sort of scenario that Descartes and other epistemologists usually appeal to in setting up the skeptical problem, so Chalmers' conclusion, if correct, is important. Sadly, nearly all the authors who bring up the issue of whether envatted Matrixers would have true beliefs adopt Chalmers' position (Mawson, Pryor, Dreyfus and Dreyfus, Clark). Grau's volume sadly lacks dissent from this controversial and unorthodox view about the envattment scenario depicted in film.

It seems to me that those mentioned have been too quick in dismissing a thought that Putnam had; in his imagined case there are no sentient beings outside the vats, no evil robots who designed the computers to simulate reality. People's envattment is not the result of an attempt to deceive, it is a strange accident. The perceptual experiences that people have, in Putnam's case, are not intended by anyone to lull people into a state of submission, they are not meant to be (false) representations of something that isn't really there. But in The Matrix the perceptual experiences people have are intended, by the evil robots, to deceive them. The robots have knowledge of the way things were in 1999, and they create a simulation of this, and hook people up to that simulation so that their perceptual experiences match the simulation. One of Putnam's theses was that some thing R that wasn't intended to represent P doesn't represent P, no matter how much R resembles P. Intention matters. Imagine, for example, that I come back from an expedition and draw a picture of a new kind of animal that I discovered, an animal that you have (prior to my return) had no causal interaction with whatsoever. I show you the picture; it represents the animal. And it represents 'the animal' even if I am making the whole story up -- in such a case you will be deceived into thinking that I encountered an animal of a certain sort. Note, importantly, that the picture will not just represent whatever caused it, e.g. my intention to deceive you. Nothing is different if you are a shut-in and have never encountered any animals apart from seeing the drawings that I bring you, they represent reality if I am being honest, and they deceive you if I am a liar. And nothing is different (how could it be?) if you are not just shut in your house, but shut in a pod of nutrient fluid, and I am not holding pictures before your working eyes, but causing perceptual experiences by stimulating your brain. If the experiences are veridical, then they represent reality, and if they are not veridical, then you are deceived.

In other words, while Chalmers (and the other contributors mentioned) think it is irrelevant that, in The Matrix "the computational processes underlying physical space-time were designed by the creators as a computer simulation of a world," (p. 141), I think that this is a mistake. Putnam's examples (the ant in the sand, the spilled paint painting) provide a compelling argument that an image's representational content -- even whether it is a representation at all -- depends crucially on its history. It matters, in other words, whether my perceptual experiences were or were not caused by another agent with the intention of deceiving me. It is an open question whether (3) entails that most envatted people's beliefs are false -- this crucially depends on whether their envattment was the result of some agent's intentions to deceive.

Chalmers could weaken his conclusion to match Putnam's, but this will significantly diminish his argument's interest -- since (unlike Putnam) Chalmers thinks that his conclusion "significantly strengthens one of the standard responses to skepticism," namely the appeal to inference to the best explanation. The scenario depicted in The Matrix is, some argue, just as good an explanation of our perceptual experiences as the anti-skeptical hypothesis that the external world is real. Chalmers' reply is that this is true -- but since the scenario depicted in The Matrix is not a skeptical hypothesis, skepticism does not threaten.

This brings me to an important (though not fatal) flaw in Grau's volume. Apart from Chalmers' very brief discussion just mentioned (pp. 174-5), an uncritical and sympathetic exposition of Cartesian skepticism in Mawson's chapter (pp. 29-36), and Grau's introductory remarks on Descartes and Putnam (pp. 10-18), there is no discussion of epistemology to be found in the book. At all three of these places where epistemological issues are discussed they are discussed as they relate to metaphysics. What's missing are chapters by epistemologists discussing epistemological solutions to the problem of skepticism. This is lamentable in a volume designed to introduce amateurs to the issues, for surely a central issue that comes up upon viewing The Matrix is "How do I know that I'm not in such a situation?" -- and yet this question receives remarkably little discussion in Grau's collection, and in general epistemological answers to the problem of skepticism are not discussed. As mentioned, some defense of the standard view -- that the scenario depicted in The Matrix is a skeptical scenario -- was needed, and along with it some sustained discussion of epistemology.

The second excellent chapter I want to talk about is Hanley's chapter on heaven and free will. Hanley presents (without endorsing) an argument from some fairly orthodox claims about heaven and free will (orthodox for Christians, anyway) to the conclusion that heaven must be a "solitary matrix" -- a virtual reality simulation built for one, where God, knowing what each heavenly person wants, "tailors each virtual environment to provide exactly that," (p. 127) or, at least, the experience of exactly that. The claims that yield this conclusion, according to Hanley, are the view that the reason earthly people sin and suffer is because earthly people have free will, the view that heavenly people have free will, and the view that, necessarily, heavenly people do not sin or suffer.

Hanley argues that the only way to reconcile these three claims is to suppose that "the existence of other human beings in the world is … a source of suffering[,] in addition to being a source of moral evil." The reason the world contains sin and suffering is because we can't all get what we want -- "If you badly want sex with another person and they badly don't want it with you, then someone is going to suffer." From this, it follows that the only way to make heaven heavenly would be to make it lonely -- although Hanley imagines that God would have to provide "plenty of (virtual) interaction with virtual humans" to satisfy the desires of heavenly people.

The weak move here is clearly Hanley's contention that the free will theodicy involves a commitment to the view that it is the presence of other free agents with conflicting desires that leads to the sin and suffering that defines our earthly existence. Can one not be tempted to sin alone? Perhaps we should explain such temptation as the possession of a desire that conflicts with a desire of God's, but then a "solitary matrix" will not solve the problem. Hanley needs the premise that the only source of sin and suffering is conflict with other people; but this is questionable. We are familiar even on earth with victimless crimes (e.g. impiety) and suffering that is not the result of a conflict of desire with someone else (e.g. existential anguish); being alone in heaven would do nothing to avoid these imperfections.

Nevertheless, Hanley's chapter is fascinating and compelling, and a perfect complement to the other chapters that discuss Nozick's "experience machine." These include the chapters by Pryor (who refutes verificationism and psychological egoism en route to his conclusion that living in The Matrix is undesirable because of a lack of political freedom) and Vasilou (who offers a lucid discussion of Nozick's issue).

There are other excellent chapters. Mawson lays out Berkeley's argument for idealism, Julia Driver makes cogent (if brief) remarks about the ethics of killing sentient computer programs and the issue of whether intentions or consequences matter in moral evaluation, and McKenna's chapter on free will deftly introduces the issue and makes the fascinating suggestion that too much freedom (e.g. the sort Neo has by the end of the film) would be awful. Partridge connects the film's themes with Plato's allegory of the cave; Wagner and Flannery-Dailey discuss the Gnostic and Buddhist themes in the film (and its sequels).

Several chapters could have been left out. Dreyfus and Dreyfus attempt to explain the history of philosophy and human thought from Homer to the 20th Century, along with Heidegger's views on freedom, but the result is more confusing than thought-provoking. Clark focuses on interpreting the film but says little of philosophical interest, apart from some vague and unclear contentions about perception towards the end of his chapter. Warwick claims that The Matrix depicts a likely future for us, and welcomes it with open arms (and bio-ports), but philosophical issues don't get any decent treatment. Most disappointing is McGinn's contribution, which consists of three brief and unrelated sets of paragraphs, two of which state, without defense, controversial and unorthodox views of dreaming and the nature of cinema, respectively, referring the reader to McGinn's recent books in lieu of argument. While most of the book's chapters consist either of serious philosophical argumentation or a critical discussion of the history of philosophy, several of these chapters (McGinn, Clark, Warwick) contain no arguments, no critical discussion of arguments, and no clear thesis. A book designed for the philosophical novice shouldn't contain these chapters -- Warwick's argument against Nozick based on the fact that "chimpanzees and rats" will repeatedly press buttons which "directly stimulate pleasure zones in their own brains" (p. 206) is the sort of reasoning undergraduates need help avoiding; an essay endorsing it should be no part of their curriculum. (That Warwick is not a philosopher explains why his reasoning is maladroit, but does not justify its inclusion in the collection.)

Nevertheless, the volume is an admirable one. Properly supplemented it would be a solid text for a course featuring the film, and anyone familiar with the film will enjoy the care that these philosophers have put into thinking about The Matrix and its philosophical themes.