For over fifty years, Barry Stroud has pushed, poked, and prodded with remarkable tenacity at what lies behind questions that many -- perhaps, most -- contemporary philosophers believe they understand, and to which they think they have definitive answers -- answers that take the form of philosophical theses or theories. Stroud is convinced that this widespread confidence about the nature of persistent philosophical problems and what counts as successful solutions to them is misplaced. Instead of promoting his own pet philosophical theses or looking for reasons to accept this or that philosophical theory, he has devoted his energies to determining the sources of these problems.
Stroud believes that a pervasive source of the diverse philosophical questions that interest us lies deep in human nature, so deep that it is not unreasonable to regard it as constitutive of the human condition itself. It is our desire to achieve a reflective understanding of ourselves and of our relation to the world around us. This desire seems to demand that we take a detached or disengaged look at ourselves, free from the concerns and constraints of ordinary life. It is this desire that makes it possible for ordinary questions about knowledge, colors, or values to take on the special character that makes them distinctively philosophical. Stroud thinks that since we do not sufficiently appreciate what this kind of understanding amounts to, we end up ignoring questions about whether philosophy can provide such an understanding and, if so, how. We do metaphysics, rather than raising fundamental questions about its very possibility.
Stroud's appreciation of the difficulty of doing philosophy, and of the obstacles that stand in our way of achieving a philosophical understanding of human nature, is evident in the seventeen essays collected here. They span four central themes that have occupied Stroud over the course of his long and distinguished career: knowledge and skepticism, subjectivity and objectivity, naturalism, and the philosophy of David Hume. While all Stroud's papers warrant and amply reward careful repeated study, I concentrate here on those most directly concerned with these themes.
One of the most formidable obstacles to our understanding both of ourselves and our relation to the world is the skeptical problem of our knowledge of the external world. "In its purest, classical form" Stroud regards this problem as the challenge of showing how each of us, working on our own with what is available to us in sense experience, can be justified in believing the many things we ordinarily take ourselves to know about the world. The problem emerged in the course of Descartes' project of finding secure foundations for science; it remains one of his most enduring legacies.
In "Our Debt to Descartes," the first essay in the volume and one of the most recently written, Stroud details how the problem arises from the kind of reflection Descartes engages in to determine what -- if anything -- he is capable of knowing. As far as he knew when he began to meditate, everything Descartes took to be most certain was due to what he had received from or though his senses. He adopted a method that required him to reject any belief that he had some reason to doubt, just as though it had actually been proven false. The creative way he applied his method led to a general challenge to our sensory beliefs that had never been raised before. Descartes argued that since there are no sure signs by which a particular sense experience can be determined to be a perception of the way things are rather than part of a dream or the product of a deceiving demon, there is nothing in any sense experience itself by which the perceiver could distinguish between them. Applied with complete generality, Descartes' arguments demand withholding judgment with respect to every sense experience. Acknowledging this general possibility gives rise to the problem of the external world.
In The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism (1984; hereafter, SPS), Stroud argued that if the traditional problem of the external world is correctly posed, then skepticism is the inevitable result. He called this "the conditional correctness of scepticism," and argued that familiar responses to skepticism failed to show either that there was something wrong with the way the problem was posed or that skepticism didn't follow from it.
Stroud goes farther in "Our Debt to Descartes." While he still accepts the conditional correctness of skepticism, he offers a diagnosis of the source of the traditional problem. As inventive and imaginative as the dream and deceiver arguments are in Descartes' application of his method of doubt, they would not pose a general challenge to our knowledge were it not for the particular conception of sense experience Descartes adopts in the Meditations. Only with that picture of sense perception does the problem take on its "especially obstinate character."
On that conception, we are never given anything in perception that we thereby perceive to be true of an "external world" of bodies, including our own. The world is "external" to us in that it is something we can't perceive or know about through sense perception alone. If we understand sense perception as "immediate experience" in this way, these experiences are necessarily 'subjective.' (Following Stroud, I use scare quotes throughout around 'subjective' and its cognates.) The problem then is how to get from our immediate experience to knowledge of or reasonable belief about the 'objective' world. Once we understand the problem this way, Stroud believes that there is no satisfactory solution to it.
Descartes was no skeptic, and he had his own way of responding to the problem he set himself. While no one accepts all the details of his solution, Stroud argues that Descartes' "cogito" reasoning expresses a rudimentary but fundamental insight that contains the seeds of a constructive solution to the traditional problem. Descartes realized that the "cogito" gave him something he knows about the world whenever he has the thought that it is true, since if that thought were false, it would mean that he didn't have that thought.
This raises the general question of what must be the case in the world if we are to have the perceptions and beliefs we have. Stroud believes that answering this question will help us overcome the idea of the independence of perception and belief from a world that either does or doesn't correspond to those perceptions and beliefs. He sees recent studies of direct indexical reference, as well as Donald Davidson's work on interpretation and understanding, and in a more general way, the thought of the later Wittgenstein, as keys to getting beyond this traditional picture and the restrictive view of perception that aids and abets it. Several of the essays in this volume pursue various aspects of this constructive line of thought.
Knowledge and Skepticism
One set of essays take up, or take off from, the theme of Stroud's perspective on the challenge posed by philosophical skepticism as he considered it in SPS.
In "Sense-Experience and the Grounding of Thought" and "Perceptual Knowledge and Epistemological Satisfaction," Stroud examines the attempts of John McDowell and Ernest Sosa, respectively, to respond to the challenge posed by the conditional correctness of skepticism. Both accounts fail for pretty much the same reason: they buy into too much of the traditional conception. Stroud applauds McDowell's awareness of the need to show that it is possible for us to understand ourselves as perceiving what is the case in the world independently of our perceptions. But he is baffled by McDowell's insistence that our judgments about the world must be grounded in "impressions." Maintaining that a purely "experiential," non-judgmental component of perceptual knowledge can somehow be "sliced off" from the rest ultimately vitiates McDowell's otherwise promising account.
Sosa's response also fails because of his concession that the most we strictly speaking can know from perception alone is "the character of our experience" and not the way things actually are. Stroud believes this commits Sosa to a restricted view of perception that, despite his "externalism," leaves us with an unsatisfactory understanding of our knowledge of the world.
Robert Fogelin, the subject of "Contemporary Pyrrhonism," is an entirely different kettle of fish. In Pyrrhonian Reflections on Knowledge and Justification (Oxford, 1994), Fogelin grants the conditional correctness of skepticism and bites the bullet, opting for a version of philosophical skepticism that Stroud thinks admirably responds to the challenge of explaining and justifying our knowledge that doesn't bring any of our ordinary or scientific knowledge into doubt. But having done so, Stroud thinks Fogelin "slips (or maybe even leaps)" into endorsing a view that leads to "obviously false conclusions" about what we ordinarily know. Fogelin argues that when we reflect on certain possibilities, "our level of scrutiny" rises, until we find ourselves unwilling to claim to know things we previously accepted without question -- such as our own names when we are confronted with the possibility that a mix up at the maternity hospital switched us with another baby.
Stroud responds that there are two important differences between "what knowledge in everyday life requires and what the traditional epistemological project requires." One difference is that we can eliminate possibilities like the hospital mix up by showing that they aren't actual, by finding things like a tape from a security camera that shows everything from Fogelin's birth to his parents taking little Robert home from the hospital. The other difference is that we can eliminate the possibility by showing that it is incompatible with all the other reasons we have for believing that his name is "Robert Fogelin." (I ignore a confusion in Fogelin's case, which Stroud seems to accept. When my sister and I wondered whether our brother was a changeling -- whether he was really the son of Edward and Kathleen Morris -- we didn't doubt that his name was "Michael Morris.")
Stroud is right to say that his reasons make it reasonable to continue to claim that he knows Fogelin's name is "Fogelin," and that he can continue to claim anything that follows from that, such as that there was no mix up at the hospital. But it is unclear that any of this would convince Fogelin when his "level of scrutiny" is high. Even the tape might be a fake designed to mislead him. One person's "level of scrutiny" is another's paranoia, which makes it difficult if not impossible to say with any generality when a heightened level of scrutiny makes considering a certain possibility reasonable and when it is simply a mark of mental disturbance.
What is clear is that Fogelin's worries, despite what he claims, can't take him to the level of philosophical skepticism. But this is not because of the two important differences Stroud points out. Fogelin may take the hospital mix up possibility seriously, but what makes his doubt about his name intelligible, even if it borders on insanity, is that he doesn't doubt, as long as he is considering the possibility of a mix up, the existence of hospitals, the perhaps questionable security camera tape, his parents, and thousands of other things. They provide the argument-context that makes his doubt possible, even if it is unreasonable. Fogelin can go on at other times to doubt other things, reasonably or unreasonably, but this kind of serial doubt is also intelligible only if other things are not doubted in each argument context. But this means that serial doubt can't generalize to the kind of global doubt about all our knowledge that skepticism demands. Whether Fogelin's doubts are reasonable or not must be decided on a case-by-case basis, but skepticism is not a possible outcome of those decisions.
The final essay in this set, "Anti-Individualism and Skepticism," considers and then goes beyond Tyler Burge's "anti-individualism," which Stroud characterizes as the view that "what thoughts a person is thinking depends on her past and present relations to what is so in the world around her." According to anti-individualism, even when we misperceive, our having a perception of the type we're having depends on our past history and the world in which our perceptual capacities have been developed and exercised. Stroud finds this "reassuring," since it means that for someone to misperceive, it must be possible for him to perceive things as they are.
The question is whether this good news provides adequate reassurance against philosophical skepticism. Burge thinks that, by itself, it doesn't. Stroud agrees, if by an argument against skepticism, we mean an argument for its negation. Such an argument must show that we do have reason to believe the things we do, and anti-individualism can't show this. But negating skepticism by showing that it is false isn't the only way, Stroud maintains, to block the threat of skepticism.
Stroud points out that anti-individualism is supported by our practices of attributing to others thoughts and attitudes with determinate content. In ascribing these thoughts and attitudes to others, we understand them to be related in appropriate ways to the things in the world that we take them to be about. Similarly, we can identify the contents of minds only in terms of what we take to be true of the independent world. We cannot consistently regard ourselves as having determinate perceptual beliefs without also regarding ourselves as not, for the most part, being in error about them. That is, belief attribution is truth ascribing -- attributed beliefs are necessarily regarded as, for the most part, true. What slogans like "error presupposes a context of veridicality" imply is that anyone who understands others or themselves to assert determinate beliefs must take those beliefs to be, for the most part, true.
The possibility with which philosophical skepticism begins poses no serious threat to any particular set of beliefs anyone might consider. But Stroud argues that this isn't because it isn't really a possibility. What follows from anti-individualism is that we can't consistently find or believe that this possibility is actual when we're considering specific determinate beliefs. Our position here, Stroud maintains, is like our position with regard to Moore's Paradox -- the sentence "It's raining but I don't believe it" -- which some call a "pragmatic paradox." It's not something we could consistently believe or assert, but not because it couldn't be true, so it is different from something's being simply inconsistent or impossible.
Stroud takes philosophical skepticism to be the negative outcome of an effort to assess all our knowledge all at once, from a position that is in some sense outside -- detached from or external to -- what we take to be our knowledge. Denying or negating that assessment would have to be made from the same detached or external position. So Stroud thinks that we shouldn't aspire to deny the thesis of skepticism, any more than we should want to accept it.
Stroud's extension of anti-individualism reveals how and why it is impossible for us even to get into that position with respect to any comprehensible set of beliefs or experiences that we can recognize ourselves to have. We understand ourselves to have beliefs only by for the most part endorsing them, but then we cannot consistently either endorse or deny philosophical skepticism. If we could accept the fact that our beliefs about the world are none the worse for all that, "perhaps final satisfaction would be at hand."
Stroud's position here is a significant move away from SPS. While he still endorses the conditional correctness of skepticism, he now denies that we can consistently endorse or engage in the practices that yield a comprehensible set of beliefs while simultaneously taking up the detached or disengaged "external" perspective that the philosophical skeptic must take up if he is to assess all our beliefs all at once.
This may be sufficient to defuse whatever threat skepticism poses. But isn't there a further move available to Stroud? If the skeptic must be engaged in attributing beliefs to others and to himself to determine the content of our beliefs, then when he takes up the detached position, does he still understand them? This suggests the stronger conclusion that the "view from nowhere" that skepticism requires is incoherent or unintelligible. The skeptic must either give content to his own beliefs by endorsing or being engaged in a position that is external to ours, from which he should be incapable of interpreting our beliefs, or else the content of his beliefs comes from his endorsement or engagement with our beliefs, in which case he is not really detached after all.
A second set of papers concerns the dichotomy between 'subjectivity' and 'objectivity,' which Stroud sees as another consequence -- or perhaps just another expression -- of the radical divide between our "immediate experience" and our beliefs about the independent world that he identified in "Our Debt to Descartes" as a pervasive feature of our Cartesian legacy.
When we ask about the nature of our beliefs about value, it may seem that a picture of how our questions should be answered -- maybe the only way they could be answered -- is implicitly built into the questions themselves. In "The Study of Human Nature and the Subjectivity of Value," Stroud's Tanner Lectures and the longest essay in this volume, as well as in "'Gilding or Staining' the World with 'Sentiments' and 'Phantasms'," Stroud argues that this picture is the result of our trying to understand ourselves in a certain way.
Here is the picture. We come to believe what we do only after we interact with the world, so there must be something about the world, and something about us, that combine to produce our beliefs. Accounting for them, then, must involve a two-part explanation. We need to determine what the world contributes -- the 'objective' factor -- and what we contribute -- the 'subjective' factor. Stroud maintains that the "intellectual goal expressed by this bipartite conception serves as our model for understanding ourselves" (90).
It may seem impossible to conceive of a better -- or even another -- way of understanding ourselves. But when we apply it to our beliefs about values, it seems to lead inevitably to 'subjectivism'. If the world is the totality of facts, how can values be part of the 'objective' world? What sort of fact could an evaluative fact be? Whatever the world may seem to contribute, our judgments about values are ultimately 'subjective'. Stroud reminds us that
the unintelligibility or 'queerness' of what values would apparently have to be if they were 'objective' has been one of the strongest arguments for 'subjectivism' [about value]. As befits a metaphysical theory, it is defended on what are really metaphysical grounds. (70)
There are many varieties of 'subjectivism', but all of them have in common the tacit acceptance of the central feature of this metaphysical theory -- its reliance on a particular conception of the way the world is -- a specific, determinate idea of the nature of 'objective' reality. This idea is a more restricted conception of the world than we accept in everyday life in that it lacks some of the things most of us think it contains. A 'subjectivist' about values eliminates all evaluative facts: nothing in his conception of the world makes them true or false.
Stroud believes that the Enlightenment project of developing a science of human nature, of which Hume's Treatise is a prime example, embodied just this conception of how we should understand ourselves. Despite Hume's avowed aversion to metaphysics, he is Stroud's poster boy for 'subjectivism':
Hume thought that not only values and colors are 'subjective', but also, most famously, causality itself. . . . This famous treatment of the idea of causality can still serve today as our best model of 'subjectivism'. Other more recent varieties can all be measured against it. (68)
Stroud thinks that it is because we want to understand human values in general in terms of this bipartite picture that we are inevitably driven toward 'subjectivism'. We want to understand the content of our evaluative beliefs, and that seems to require that we explain that content in terms of what is or could be the case in the 'objective' world. But any such explanations will have to be in terms of something that is not itself evaluative, so they will always fall short of accounting for their evaluative content. That content, then, must be located in the 'subjective' realm, which means that they can't assert anything that is or could be true of the way things are.
Despite the pervasiveness of this picture, Stroud argues that when we look closely at what adopting it really requires, we can see that it involves an unavoidable tension that ultimately vitiates 'subjectivism'. The 'subjectivist's' metaphysical project requires that we have genuinely evaluative beliefs about the world while also holding that none of them are true. It requires that we acknowledge these evaluations while prohibiting us from endorsing their contents. It demands that we detach from our evaluative beliefs while simultaneously engaging with them.
Stroud questions whether the 'subjectivist' can consistently fulfill these requirements. In doing so, he appeals to the same sorts of general conditions for interpreting, understanding, and successfully ascribing to others or to ourselves beliefs with specific contents that we saw him employ in his discussion of Burge's anti-individualism.
To take what Stroud regards as "a parallel case," when we acknowledge that someone has a particular belief about color -- that avocados are green, for example -- we need to connect her belief with the facts in the world that we take her belief to be about. This requires some surroundings. Among other things, we need to determine that she's talking about avocados, not lemons, as well as determining that she believes that avocados are the same color as grass. But if we had no opinions at all about what color avocados are, then we couldn't make the required connection and wouldn't be in a position to attribute that belief to her. Successful belief attribution therefore requires that we too engage in the practice of attributing color to things in the world, which in turn requires that we too must take the color of avocados to be true of the world. We must take our color beliefs to be true, at least for the most part, if we are to succeed in attributing color beliefs to others. As Stroud puts the point, "what we take to be the facts of the world are implicated in our making sense of thoughts of the world. The two cannot be pried apart completely" (96-97).
But since 'subjectivism' also requires that we detach ourselves from these practices, it demands that we refuse to endorse the contents of our evaluations. But without ascribing color to things in the world, and hence holding color beliefs of our own that we take to be true, it is difficult to see how we could understand others, and even ourselves, as holding any beliefs about color at all.
'Subjectivism' requires that we not only regard the beliefs of others, but also our own beliefs, as false. But we can successfully regard another's belief as false only if we can understand her to share other beliefs with us. Only in that context can we make her particular false belief intelligible.
If we satisfy 'subjectivism's' first requirement -- that we do hold genuinely evaluative beliefs -- it is hard to conceive how we could satisfy its second requirement -- that we regard all those beliefs, including our own, as false. If we detach ourselves from being in an engaged position from which we can understand the contents of the beliefs of others as well as our own, we lose our grip on those beliefs altogether.
Stroud concludes that these facts about interpretation and the ascription of belief are "enough . . . to prevent us from ever arriving at the 'subjectivist' picture of the world." But he is careful to warn that "I mean only that we could never consistently arrive at the 'subjectivist' conception of value or color, not that that conception is false, or necessarily false, or a contradiction" (101). Stroud doesn't say, as he did in his discussion of Burge, that inability to consistently fulfill all that 'subjectivism' requires is a "Moore's Paradox" situation, where a proposition expressing both requirements could be true but is something we can't consistently assert. But he does think that what he has shown effectively removes whatever threat 'subjectivism' poses: "Denying 'subjectivism' is not the only way of avoiding it" (102).
But perhaps Stroud has identified a more serious internal problem with 'subjectivism' than he acknowledges. If the 'subjectivist' loses the content of our beliefs about values and colors when he abandons his engagement with our practices of interpreting and understanding our beliefs in general, then taking up the detached position that 'subjectivism' requires is not one from which he can evaluate our evaluations, or any of our beliefs at all. This detached position, divorced by necessity from any knowledge or belief about the content of our beliefs, if it can be made coherent, is not detachment at all. It is complete isolation.
At any rate, he is also at pains to remind us that we shouldn't construe his resistance to 'subjectivism' about value as a defense of the view that values are 'objective'. He notes that our tendency to draw that conclusion itself testifies to the "power of that traditional metaphysical dichotomy." This tendency, Stroud maintains, "is the place to look for the real source of 'subjectivism' about values." It is also what helps explain "why we can expect that some form of the view will always be with us" (102).
Given Stroud's critique, the obvious solution would be to ditch the traditional dichotomy altogether, but what that might look like is much harder to say. However, doing so might make room for a reassessment of some of those who have been tarred with the brush of 'subjectivism'. Hume in particular might turn out to be far less wedded to our Cartesian heritage than we all too commonly assume.
A trio of essays, "The Charm of Naturalism," "The Transparency of 'Naturalism'," and "The Constraints of Hume's Naturalism," represent the third central theme in Stroud's work. The issues he raises about philosophical naturalism closely parallel those he introduced in his discussion of 'subjectivism': the status of values, colors, and causation, and how the restrictions metaphysical theories impose constrain our views about what the world contains and our access to it. Hume is again one of the main culprits.
Stroud thinks that Hume's project of developing a science of human nature, for all its failings, at least succeeded in giving a determinate sense to his naturalism. But the result was a "disaster," although naturalism as a project wasn't its source, or at least, not its only source. Stroud concentrates on what he takes to be "the special embarrassments and dissatisfactions of Hume's naturalism" (195), to draw some conclusions about the prospects of philosophical naturalism in general.
Hume's naturalism, Stroud maintains, involves a particular constraint that ultimately hobbles it. His project must proceed in full awareness of the "restricted character" of impressions -- the "fleeting and momentary" nature of our "immediate experience." Impressions are the "input" from which he must begin in accounting for the "huge gap" between our impressions and our picture of the world and our place in it -- the "output." Stroud argues that this impoverished input presses a Humean scientist of human nature to discover some "principles of the imagination" that will explain why we believe the things we do.
He argues that there are two distinctive features of the way Hume's naturalism develops that make it difficult to accept his conclusions. First, when Hume finds that his resources in impressions and ideas aren't enough to account for our ideas of many of the features of the world we all believe in, he appeals to "fictions." Stroud stresses that "the 'fictional' or purely subjectively-generated character" of these beliefs extends to all our beliefs in any physical objects, in any active, thinking subjects, in any causal connections, and in any moral qualities of any actions or persons. In fact, "the whole conception from one end to the other is . . . an elaborate put-up job that the human mind cannot help indulging in" (202).
Stroud thinks that this is hard enough to swallow, but what makes it "doubly difficult" is that all this applies to us as well. He believes this is what happened to Hume himself, accounting for the disturbing plight he describes so vividly in the final section of Book I of the Treatise. He believes that the results of Hume's naturalistic project didn't give him the kind of understanding he wanted to achieve, and that it doesn't give us the understanding we expect from the study of other parts of nature.
The lesson Stroud draws from Hume's "disaster" is that Hume's naturalistic project failed because his resources -- "impressions and ideas coming and going in the mind" -- were inadequate to yield judgments or beliefs which he held to be true or false. This is another consequence of Descartes' legacy. Any other version of naturalism that begins from a similar appeal to "immediate experience" will also fail. Adequately explaining our thoughts and beliefs requires a "relatively rich conception of nature" that includes a world of enduring bodies and embodied humans who interact with them and with one another.
Stroud also draws a moral about naturalism in general. If naturalism is anything more than a slogan, it must have a determinate meaning and specific content. As we saw in Hume's case, giving naturalism determinate content seems to require that it operate with a restricted conception of the world. The restrictions imposed needn't be Hume's, of course, but the content does need to be restricted in some way or other.
This poses a dilemma for naturalism. One alternative is to take these restrictions as saying that the thoughts and beliefs the theory excludes aren't really part of the natural world, in which case the naturalist must dismiss them as merely 'subjective,' as we saw earlier in the cases of value and color. This gives determinate content to naturalism, but only by denying the truth of thoughts and beliefs we all take to be true. The other alternative is to relax the standards for what counts as part of the natural world, so that values or colors will be included. But this way of accommodating our thoughts and beliefs draws the teeth of naturalism. All naturalism means in this form is "that we must accept as true everything we find we have to accept in order to make sense of everything that we think is part of the world" (239). Now the claims of naturalism are little more than platitudes.
While we can think of naturalism as opposed to supernaturalism or to a priori philosophical restrictions on legitimate inquiry, in both cases there are good reasons for opposing these views or methods. Stroud thinks that we should evaluate these reasons on their own merits, irrespective of whether they are called "naturalism" or not.
This leads Stroud to make a "modest recommendation," which encapsulates what he calls "the transparency of naturalism:" "In philosophy you have to look right through the term to see in each case what it is meant to stand for." In the case of naturalism,
it has some determinate but still very general meaning as opposition to certain a priori philosophical doctrines. But otherwise we are left with nothing much more than the idea of careful, informed investigation, or perhaps just responsible inquiry. That is not nothing to be left with. It is all we've got. But there is no need to decide in advance how inquiry into whatever interests us must, or must not, proceed. (255)
Stroud's take on Hume's philosophy, his fourth central theme, has been heavily anticipated in his discussions of subjectivity and naturalism. His approach will also be familiar to readers of "Problems and Prospects of Humean Naturalism," the final chapter of his now-classic Hume (1978).
As we have seen, Stroud argues that Hume's uncritical acceptance of the theory of ideas forced him to the view that what we immediately perceive falls short of the independent world of physical objects, persons, causal connections, and good and bad states of affairs in which we all believe. Here yet again Stroud sees Hume as the passive victim of his -- and our -- Cartesian heritage. His meager resources give him no way of spanning the gap between his immediate experiences and the independent world, leaving him with these "sceptical" conclusions about many of our beliefs, which render his naturalism ultimately "dissatisfying."
"Hume's Scepticism: Natural Instincts and Philosophical Reflection" fills out this picture considerably. Focusing on the question of what Hume means by his skepticism, Stroud offers a detailed account of the structure and role of "Conclusion of this book," the final chapter of Book I of the Treatise. Stroud unquestionably makes his "case for the indispensability of a proper understanding" of the Conclusion "for any serious account of Hume's philosophy" (5). Not everyone will agree with every detail of Stroud's reading of this difficult and controversial section, but anyone who has a serious interest in understanding Hume's skepticism ignores this seminal and elegant essay at his or her peril.
One of the virtues of this essay is that it unifies central doctrines of the Treatise with those of the Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, especially the idea that Hume's skepticism in the Treatise is of a piece with the "mitigated scepticism" Hume advocates in the Enquiry. This theme is also developed for a more general audience in "Hume's An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding," where Stroud argues that the Enquiry, especially its first and final sections, "explain better than before the distinctive character and importance of 'scepticism' as Hume understands it" (4). As he sees Hume's skepticism, it is not merely an academic doctrine, but something much closer to the ancient view, where skepticism was a way of living. It is a full appreciation of "the real power of nature and instinct over reason" and the need for "accurate and just reasoning," which, when followed correctly, can overcome dogmatism and prejudice and "lead to a less disturbed, more fully satisfying, and more balanced way of life" (116).
Stroud is keenly aware of how deep the "traditional metaphysical dichotomy" that is our heritage from Descartes runs. Although he believes that we can't get a satisfactory understanding of ourselves that way, he also thinks "we can expect that some form of the view will always be with us" (102). Does this mean that our "metaphysical dissatisfaction" is doomed to be permanent? Is it an inextricable part of the human condition? Are we incapable of abandoning our Cartesian heritage, even when Stroud shows us just how flawed it is?
Stroud's expressions of pessimism are sometimes tempered with an optimistic note that from time to time helps dispel the clouds of "metaphysical dissatisfaction." When he is encouraged by his extensions and applications of the insights of Wittgenstein and Davidson, he suggests that this work
perhaps promises eventually to overcome the almost irresistible idea of a completely global independence of all thought and perception from whatever world there might happen to be that either does or does not match up to those thoughts and perceptions. (27-28)
He adds, "To get beyond that . . . conception altogether would be a formidable advance in human understanding" (28). Unfortunately Stroud offers us no account of what would replace the bipartite conception of 'subjectivity' and 'objectivity' in a post-Cartesian world. Some problems that are a direct consequence of Descartes' legacy -- the problem of the external world, perhaps -- might disappear altogether. Others might be transmuted into radically different forms. But in any case we would still have with us the problem of understanding ourselves and our relation to the world in a distinctively philosophical way. As a guide to that form of understanding, and the difficulties involved in trying to achieve it, Stroud is without peer.