Philosophical Anthropology: Wittgenstein's Perspective

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Jesús Padilla Gálvez (ed.), Philosophical Anthropology: Wittgenstein's Perspective, Ontos, 2010, 180pp., $106.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380675.

Reviewed by Sally Ann Ness and Erich H. Reck, University of California at Riverside


This volume contains twelve chapters: an editorial introduction by Jesús Padilla Gálvez and eleven essays, written by an international group of contributors (three from Spain, two from Portugal, two from Finland, and one each from Austria, Mexico, the UK, and the US). The introduction and nine of the essays are in English, while the other two are in German.[1] For Wittgenstein scholars in the English-speaking world, some of the contributors will be quite familiar (Robert Fogelin, P.M.S. Hacker, Lars Hertzberg). Among those probably less familiar, several are major Wittgenstein scholars in the Spanish- and Portuguese-speaking world (Alejandro Tomasini Bassols, Padilla Gálvez, António Marques, Nuno Venturinha), while the remaining ones work primarily in other fields (Manuel García-Carnpintero, Nicanor Ursua) or are more junior (Christian Kanzian, Olli Lagerspetz). The volume is an outcome of the International Congress of Philosophy, University of Castilla-La Mancha, Toledo (Spain), in September 2009. As the editor states in the introduction, the main criteria for inclusion of talks from the conference were a) the unity of the subject and b) the originality of the contributions.

As highlighted by the title and emphasized further in the introduction, the main subject of the volume is "to investigate the anthropological questions Wittgenstein raised in his works" and, conversely, "to assess Wittgenstein's philosophy from the point of view of anthropology" (p. 12); or as the editor also puts it, the subject is "Wittgenstein's thoughts concerning philosophical anthropology", on the one hand, and "the importance of anthropology for philosophical discussion and speculation", on the other hand (p. 14). The latter dichotomy signals already that one should not expect a very tight unity in the end. And as a matter of fact, in the different chapters one encounters a whole spectrum of approaches: from close readings of Wittgenstein's texts to essays that have very little to do with Wittgenstein but are involved, in some sense or to some degree (sometimes minimal), with "anthropological" issues. Further questions about the unity of the volume arise when one asks what exactly is meant by anthropology, or more specifically, in which sense creating an interface between philosophy and anthropology is the goal. This ranges from engagements with the actual discipline of anthropology (as a social science), through a variety of rather general, largely philosophical reflections on "human nature" (under the ambiguous label "philosophical anthropology"[2]), all the way to specific debates in the philosophy of language and the philosophy of technology. Most of the contributors seem to take the appeal to "anthropology" simply to signal a concern for general issues involving language and other socially organized, conventional human activities.

Our primary focus in this review will be on those chapters that make a sustained attempt to connect Wittgenstein's work in philosophy to the discipline of anthropology. But first we will provide a more general overview, as orientation for potential readers. Very roughly, the eleven essays can be divided into three groups. In the first group fall those pieces that address Wittgenstein and the discipline of anthropology together. This includes: the essay by Hacker, which ties a general discussion of "ethnology", starting from the work of James Frazer, to Wittgenstein's goal of distancing us from problematic philosophical assumptions; the essay by Marques, which distinguishes two senses of Wittgenstein's notion of "form of life" and explores their relevance for "anthropological representation"; and  the essay by Lagerspetz, who shows how the kinds of concepts discussed by anthropologists, specifically those of "dirty" and "clean", can be investigated profitably by examining the surrounding activities and practices along Wittgensteinian lines. Of the pieces in this first group, the first two are grounded in close readings of Wittgenstein's texts and bring in anthropology in an instrumental way, while the third is an application of Wittgenstein's perspective to anthropology, without any sustained exegetical discussion.

In our second group fall four essays that, while again engaging with central themes in Wittgenstein's philosophy, connect to "anthropology" only insofar as they address basic philosophical issues concerning "human life". Of these, both the essay by Fogelin and  the essay by Tomasini Bassols discuss Wittgenstein's approach to meaning, habitual activity, and the origin of philosophical misconceptions, and each does so by comparing Wittgenstein’s approach to those of other philosophers. Fogelin elaborates some striking parallels between Wittgenstein’s and Hume's discussions on belief formation and human nature, while Tomasini Bassols contrasts Wittgenstein's perspective on meaning sharply with that in "conventional philosophy", i.e., the approach of philosophers such as Donald Davidson and Michael Dummett.

The paper by Padilla Galvéz addresses the question of how we come to understand other human beings, together with issues concerning the constitution of the subject or self, and Wittgenstein's approach is compared favorably with philosophical views based on an "ego-centric", Cartesian perspective. The most exegetical of all the essays is perhaps that by Venturinha, in which Wittgenstein's appeal to "the natural history of human beings" is traced through various texts from his Nachlass and tied to methodological issues about "surveyability"; the essay closes with a suggestive comparison of Wittgenstein to the poet Novalis.

The remaining four essays in the volume can again be grouped together, although only in a looser sense. Two of them represent applications of a Wittgensteinian approach to classic philosophical problems, even though the connection to Wittgenstein is not very explicit. In a thoughtful essay, Hertzberg focuses on human volition and related questions about authority, autonomy, and responsibility; he explores these in the form of a critical appraisal of some famous, or infamous, psychological experiments by Benjamin Libet and others. In the essay by Kanzian, the topic is the mind-body problem, or rather the question in which sense there is such a problem in the first place; and its author proposes to treat it as a special case of understanding "the diverse aspects making up the complexity of the unity of macro-things" more generally.

With the last two essays, by García-Carpintero and by Ursua, we are back to a connection to anthropology, in one way or another, but the approach is not very Wittgensteinian. García-Carpientero discusses questions concerning meaning, conventionality, and linguistic "force", in the context of speech act theory, starting with ideas from Austin, Grice, and Strawson. Ursua provides a helpful, general survey of recent work in the philosophy of technology on "converging technologies" and "human enhancement", i.e., on various technological ways of "improving our cognitive and interactive abilities, health, and social standards", from seeing and hearing aids, cosmetic surgery, and psycho-pharmaka to the human genome project, nano- and bio-technology, and artificial intelligence.

Let us now come back to the stated subject of the collection: "to investigate the anthropological questions Wittgenstein raised in his works" and to "assess Wittgenstein's philosophy from the point of view of anthropology". As already pointed out, most of the essays are informed by a very general sense of "anthropology", seen simply, and somewhat vaguely, as the investigation of basic aspects of "human nature" or "human natural history". One might, in contrast, have expected the core theme to be (actual and possible) connections between Wittgenstein's works and the discipline of anthropology.

But if one approaches the volume with this expectation, one will be largely disappointed. Only three of the authors -- Hacker, Marques, and Lagerspetz -- discuss issues directly relevant to that theme. Among them, Lagerspetz is alone in taking contemporary anthropology, or a particular issue within it, to be his reference point. Hacker considers the discipline of anthropology as well, but he essentially equates it with ethnology -- the comparative study of cultures one can find in Frazer's Golden Bough, a text familiar to Wittgenstein. He thus narrows it down to a particular, dated sub-field of socio-cultural anthropology. Marques, in turn, equates "anthropological interest" with one that seeks "the deepest possible understanding of what human life is", thereby leading us back to a very general understanding of it. Yet Marques then turns to some interesting, more specific issues at the interface of philosophy and current anthropology.

With the last few remarks, we have already switched from a philosophical to a more anthropological perspective on the anthology. Let us now make this switch more fully and further consider the essays by Hacker, Lagerspetz, and Marques from that perspective. Doing so will also lead us to some suggestions for future work.

With respect to virtually all the uses of the term 'anthropology' in the present volume, including Marques' and Hacker's (but not Lagerspetz's), practicing anthropologists may well feel somewhat alienated. It is not that they would disagree with Marques' and others' goal of gaining "the deepest possible understanding of what human life is". On the contrary, that basic objective is quite aptly characterized. However, an anthropologist would conceive of what the achievement of that objective amounts to in very different terms. First and foremost, anthropology, as a contemporary social science, is concerned primarily with the study of human diversity, in all its sub-disciplines, rather than with the identification of human universals (as classical ethnology was and as philosophy tends to be in general). This basic fact about the discipline's orientation is missed almost entirely in the anthology. The oversight would, perhaps, be of relatively minor import were it not for the fact that Wittgenstein himself does, in critically important ways, share this interest in the diversity of human thought and experience. His aversion to the formation of general theses, together with his push to conceive of contexts of practice that are as different from familiar ones as humanly possible (and perhaps even then some), aligns Wittgenstein's work -- at least his later work -- most closely with what is considered contemporary in social and cultural anthropological inquiry.

This difference in vision regarding what anthropological inquiry seeks to accomplish, in the present day and age, is tied closely to problems of two related kinds -- still speaking from a contemporary anthropological perspective. (How significant these problems are for contemporary philosophy is a separate question, we recognize, but one that arguably deserves further attention.) The first is a tendency on the part of the authors to over-generalize, even universalize, and characterize as "natural" certain human phenomena that have been shown by anthropological research to exhibit culturally specified diversity. For instance, Hacker makes universalist claims with regard to human emotions being rooted in "natural behavior". While this view maintains some adherents in anthropology (predominantly in biological anthropology) and is supported by behavioral research initially undertaken in the 1960s, it has grown increasingly controversial in recent decades, as socio-cultural study has generated a broader data base from which to identify a much wider array of observable emotional expressions rooted in cultural practice, even with respect to "basic" emotions, than was previously thought to be the case.

A second kind of problem -- and, perhaps, a more significant one from an cross-disciplinary perspective -- is a tendency to rely on definitions of "culture" (or on an implicit understanding of human activities that are "socialized and coordinated", as Tomasini Bassols puts it on p. 57) that the discipline of anthropology, since the 1980s, has found questionable and increasingly has established to be inaccurate. Hacker's assertion, for example, that "the world in which concepts form is by and large regular" (p. 24) is no longer well supported by anthropological research. Anthropologists now recognize that the impact of large-scale phenomena such as imperialism, migration, and disease dissemination, or more recently, post-colonialism, globalization, and climate change, produce irregularities that are a key and chronic component of how human "forms of life" (imperfectly) cohere. Such factors interact to produce disjunctures and irregularities in cultural transmission, thus complicating the picture of conceptualization as well as other conventional cultural formations with which the volume's authors are concerned.

Hacker also asserts that the ethnological approach "helps to distance one from the phenomena that bewilder us in our philosophical reflections and confusions" (p. 28). This may well be the case. From an anthropological point of view, however, Hacker misses an all-important fact about such distancing processes. Anthropologically speaking, these cannot be achieved by any means other than actual immersion in an unfamiliar way of life. This conviction accompanied the great methodological advance in cultural anthropology pioneered by such seminal figures as Franz Boas and Bronislaw Malinowsky in the early twentieth century. Both insisted that participant-observation field research must take the place of the kind of "armchair" comparative speculation that is exemplified well in James Frazer's writings. In the wake of this advance, the adoption of a foreign way of life on its own home ground, so to speak, became an integral part of anthropological methodology. In this regard, the distancing advocated by Hacker is rather limited and somewhat dubious. The "pseudo-ethnology" it produces is, perhaps, even further removed from actual disciplinary practice than Wittgenstein's pseudo-historical constructions, which some contributors to this volume also investigate.

From an anthropological perspective, another striking feature of this anthology -- and an ironic one -- is that its authors do not engage with the one area of anthropology to which Wittgenstein's philosophical work is most directly related and where it has had the greatest impact: contemporary interpretive ethnography (as opposed to ethnology). It is here -- in no small part due to the writings of the cultural anthropologist, Clifford Geertz, who was well versed in Wittgenstein's philosophy -- that Wittgenstein's private language argument and the corresponding focus on habitual activities, social practices, forms of life, etc., has been set to work in anthropological field studies, with revolutionary and enduring results. Indeed, there is good reason to think of this subfield, with its objective of documenting the distinctive character of given ways of life, as constituting a Wittgensteinian branch of the discipline of anthropology.[3] Shouldn’t a volume that sets itself the goal of "investigating anthropological questions Wittgenstein raised in his work", and especially, of "assessing Wittgenstein's philosophy from the point of view of anthropology", consider such work in some detail?

The above critical comments notwithstanding, we would like to close this review with some positive observations and suggestions. Olli Lagerspetz, in his contribution, does identify an interest that brings Wittgenstein's philosophy into the domain of ethnographic inquiry, one that also speaks to the distancing problem identified above. As Lagerspetz rightly notes, both Wittgenstein and the ethnographer tend to ask the same question: "What kind of a world is a world where [a given concept or practice] has a sensible life?" (p. 157). To the extent that Wittgenstein's project of conceptual analysis implies an investigation of what it is in practice to "care for" the objects falling under a relevant concept (pp. 160-61), this necessitates a certain kind of "worldly" investigation of those concepts.

The critique Lagerspetz makes of anthropologist Mary Douglas' structuralist symbolic analysis of the concepts of "clean" and "dirty" -- the only engagement with an actual anthropologist's research in the anthology -- illuminates how Wittgenstein's interests led him to the brink of this specifically ethnographic perspective, as opposed to that adopted by Douglas. This is an insightful, highly relevant contrast. Lagerspetz thus begins to map out the path by which Wittgenstein arrived at an interest in conducting distinctly ethnographic exercises. That Wittgenstein forged this pathway so unerringly up to the boundary of the ethnographer's territory is an intriguing result, whose further investigation would be of significance to both disciplines.

Besides Lagerspetz's, the most interesting contribution to the volume from a cross-disciplinary standpoint -- the standpoint from which philosophy and anthropology might be brought into a fruitful dialogue -- is Marques' chapter. Marques seeks to identify what purpose Wittgenstein understood the representations that he called "anthropological" or "ethnological" to be serving in his own work. He asserts that these representations were designed either to "enlarge the scope of our understanding of a human form of life or to fix its boundaries" (p. 61). What is often at stake in this kind of descriptively oriented, particularist study is, as Marques notes in connection with Wittgenstein's remarks on Frazer's Golden Bough, the "comprehension of peculiarities of human life" (p. 64). Marques' essay characterizes concisely the crux of the intersection between Wittgenstein's project and ethnographic anthropology. He also identifies something like a common purpose, which is to enlarge "the scope of our understanding of what a pattern of life is if one refers to a human one" (p. 65). Here, Wittgenstein's interest aligns closely with an ethnographic interest: to particularize so as to add to the understanding of a distinct pattern of human diversity.

Ultimately, this volume may well leave anthropological readers with the sense that Wittgenstein -- who made no claim to being a philosophical anthropologist -- actually was a better example of this interdisciplinary figure than any of the authors contributing to the present anthology. However, he was so, not in the spirit of Frazer's ethnological ilk, nor of any naturalist variety, as is suggested in some of the essays.[4] Rather, his approach connects most with the ethnographic tradition pioneered by Boas and Malinowsky, in the early twentieth century, and enriched by the advent of interpretive social science, in the late twentieth century.

This is a curious achievement, done through a practice that is only pseudo-ethnographical. It raises the question of how Wittgenstein creates the conditions that enable him to illuminate the complications in an imagined way of life, complications that go without saying except by someone unfamiliar to that way -- even while he himself is not unfamiliar with it but is, in fact, constructing it. Besides connecting with integral questions about philosophical methodology, this uncanny achievement is something that anthropologists would do well to examine closely and seek to understand better. It might allow them to identify and criticize anthropological work that may be no more than a Wittgensteinian pseudo-exploration and to differentiate it from work that is genuinely cross-cultural in understanding (if there even is any).

In sum, seen from a current anthropological standpoint, the present volume does not come across as a work of anthropology, despite the implications of its title and some suggestions in its introduction. Its authors are not "doing anthropology" any more than Wittgenstein is "doing history", as Hacker observes. Nor do they engage with the anthropological record, productive as that might have been. The branch of inquiry to which the volume belongs might perhaps be called "anthropologicist" or "ethnologicist" philosophy, were those terms not quite so unwieldy. Then again, at its best the volume establishes that there is an interface between philosophy and anthropology, and that this interface, particularly as created in Wittgenstein's work, is potentially of significance to both disciplines. It would seem to be in their mutual interest to explore this interface collaboratively. In this respect, the anthology constitutes something of a missed opportunity -- but it also points towards a promising area for future work.

That said, it should be acknowledged that the anthology as a whole contributes substantively to the discipline of philosophy, as was surely its primary objective. The best of its chapters do so in one or both of two ways: by deepening our understanding of Wittgenstein's methodology, and by illustrating how that methodology can be applied to current philosophical problems. From this (largely philosophical) point of view, the volume is valuable specifically in terms of bringing the research of Wittgenstein scholars from the Spanish- and Portuguese-speaking world to the attention of an English-speaking audience. But this also leads to a final criticism. From a scholarly point of view, the volume is lacking in several ways: It contains no index; there is virtually no information about the contributors (which would have been particularly helpful in this case); and many essays in it are littered with typos and other typographic errors, i.e., the proof-reading was of poor quality. It is to be hoped that future books in the Aporia series, of which this is the first installment, will be significantly improved in those respects.

[1] Several of the essays in the volume are translations from other languages (including one from Basque), but not always adequate translations. Some of the English essays contain long quotations from Wittgenstein in the original German, which limits their value for readers not fluent in German.

[2] In his introduction, Jesús Padilla Gálvez points towards the twentieth-century German school of "philosophical anthropology" (Scheler, Plessner, Gehlen, etc.). But few of the other authors make contact with that particular tradition; most understand the term in a broader, vaguer sense.

[3] Cf. Clifford Geertz, The Interpretation of Cultures, Basic Books, 1973, and Local Knowledge: Further Essays in Interpretive Anthropology, Basic Books, 1983. For later work by anthropologists in which the connection to Wittgenstein is explored, see Mark Whitaker, "Ethnography as Learning: A Wittgensteinian Approach to Writing Ethnographic Accounts", Anthropological Quarterly 69 (1996), 1-13, and Veena Das, "Wittgenstein and Anthropology", Annual Review of Anthropology 27 (1998), 171-195.

[4] As Padilla Gálvez writes in his introduction:

Representatives of philosophical anthropology [at the beginning of the twentieth century] just had ceased considering rationality as the ultimate explanation of human thinking and action. Rationality is rather determined by the biological and social conditions in which the lives of human beings are embedded (p. 7).

The naturalist side of "philosophical anthropology" is emphasized strongly here, and this finds echoes, in a variety of ways, in other essays.