Philosophical Biology in Aristotle's Parts of Animals

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Jason A. Tipton, Philosophical Biology in Aristotle's Parts of Animals, Springer, 2014, 207pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319014203.

Reviewed by Andrea Falcon, Concordia University (Montreal)


This book is a study of the overall argument and contents of Aristotle's Parts of Animals (hereafter PA). Tipton writes that in view of the renewed interest in Aristotle's natural philosophy, he aims to develop a new avenue of research "with an eye to both the empirical and philosophical." This approach, he suggests, will help us "begin to understand better Aristotle's philosophical biology at the same time as trying to understand his biological philosophy" (p. 9).

After a general introduction (chapter 1: "Aristotle's Philosophy and Biology: The Biological Phenomena"), Tipton offers his own reading of the main lines of the argument in PA I. He attempts a reconstruction of what he calls the movement of PA I in chapters 2 and 3. While chapter 2 ("The Problem of Beginnings") contains a discussion of the methodological remarks advanced in PA I 1, chapter 3 ("Recognizing Sameness and Otherness in Animals") focuses on Aristotle's criticism of the method of dichotomous division in PA I 2-3 and his discussion of the formation of popularly designated groups of animals in PA I 4. The connection between PA I 1 and PA I 2-4 is not immediately obvious. Tipton finds it in a key methodological precept advanced in PA I 5, where we are told that it is necessary first to divide the per se attributes pertaining to each kind, and after that to try to divide their causes (645b1-4). He suggests that this precept is a direct answer to the question introduced at the outset of the investigation, where Aristotle wonders whether we should engage in a separate study of each of the different kinds of animals, or whether we should begin with a study of the attributes that are common to many kinds of animals (639a16-19).[1]

The norms of inquiry for the study of animals outlined in PA I are applied in PA II-IV.[2] By Tipton's lights, "much of the argument of the PA seems to revolve around not only the final and the necessary, but also around the common and the particular as it relates to function" (p. 107). Perhaps one way to rephrase this statement is to say that the study of how the final/formal cause is used together with the material and the efficient cause in the explanation of the functions of the various bodily parts. This study begins by giving the common function of a bodily part, and continues by examining the more specialized functions that differ according to the various kinds. The second part of the book under review attempts to give a plausible account of the argument of the PA by detailing how this teleological-necessary framework of inquiry is implemented in PA II-IV. Chapter 4 ("The Examination of the Animate in Light of the Inanimate: Or, the Argument for the Autonomy of the Zoological Inquiry") presents the content of PA II, which is divided into a study of the uniform parts (PA II 1-9) and a study of the non-uniform parts (PA II 10 to the end of the book). Chapter 5 ("Finding Fault with Nature") focuses on PA III, which Tipton describes, at the most general level, as "a deepening of the argument that examines how the necessary/final understanding illuminates and is illuminated by the recognition of common, generic and specific functions" (109). Chapter 6 ("The Division and Combination of Labor") turns to PA IV. For the author, PA IV illustrates the necessary movement from the application of the principle of the division of labor according to which one part has one job to the recognition that multiple functions are often packed together into a single part.

After this quick review of the book's contents, I turn to Tipton's project as a whole. He commendably takes the PA to be a single philosophical project worthy of a careful analysis for its own sake. Unfortunately, its programmatic focus on the PA is understood in a rather narrow way, as if the PA could be read in isolation from the rest of the Aristoteliancorpus. In my view, this prevents us from arriving at a full appreciation of Aristotle's argumentative strategy. I illustrate this with the help of a couple of examples.

For the first example, let's return to PA I. It is indisputable that this book builds on some of the results reached in Physics II. The doctrine of the four causes is a case in point. In PA I, Aristotle presupposes that there are four kinds of cause (what we call the formal, the final, the efficient, and the material cause). But where does Aristotle argue for the existence of a plurality of answers to the why-question? He does so in Physics II. There, Aristotle argues that up to four causes are involved in the explanation of natural phenomena, and that the task of the student of nature is to bring the why-question back to them all. To make a long story short, PA I and Physics II seem to be integrated in some way. For the purpose of this review, it is not necessary to be more precise on how this integration is to be understood. Here suffice it to say that by not taking into account the systematic connections between Physics II and PA I, Tipton fails to show how the PA is part of a larger explanatory project.

Second example: a central concern in the ongoing research on Aristotle's natural philosophy is the connection between the theory of science that Aristotle outlines in the Posterior Analytics and the practice of science that we find in his writings on natural philosophy. Against a tendency to underplay the systematic connections between theory and practice in Aristotle's science, the most recent research has established that the theory of science outlined in the Posterior Analytics controls Aristotle's practice of science. Tipton makes no explicit attempt to establish contact with this important trend in scholarly research.[3]

The lack of engagement with this tradition comes at a price. By not considering the connection with the Posterior Analytics, the theoretical motivations behind some of the questions that Tipton rightly considers crucial for a full understanding of the explanatory strategy adopted in the PA are not fully appreciated. It seems to me, for instance, that when Aristotle asks whether we should engage in separate investigations about the different kinds of animals, or whether we should posit the attributes that are common to many, or even all, kinds of animals in order to study them in common, his question makes full sense only in light of the theory of scientific explanation outlined in the Posterior Analytics. I grant that Aristotle does not make the connection with the Posterior Analytics explicit in this case. However, it is only by giving explanations at the right level of generality that we can capture salient features that might be otherwise missed.[4] The same point can be made in connection with the precept advanced in PA I 5, where we are told it is necessary first to divide the per se attributes pertaining to each kind, and after that to try to divide their causes (645b1-4). This methodological precept too makes full sense only in light of the requirement that scientific explanations must be given at the right level of generality.

The Index Locorum, which lists only passages from the PA and the Historia Animalium, is clear evidence of the narrow focus of Tipton's book. Even granted that not all passages he cites are collected in his Index, as they should be (I have noticed that a few from outside the PA are not), there is no doubt that Tipton has made a programmatic decision to concentrate on the argument and contents of the PA in isolation from the rest of Aristotle's writings on natural philosophy, including those that contribute directly to the study of animals (with the notable exception of the Historia Animalium). This narrow focus is one of the book's limitations. Another limitation is that Tipton does not engage with the scholarly work that has been done outside the Anglo-American world. And yet, the PA has been the object of a great deal of attention in recent years, and not all the attention is from scholars writing in English.[5] Both limitations considerably reduce the potential interest of his book. On the bright side, the book has the merit of taking the PA seriously as a philosophical project. Readers interested in the PA will find in these pages an introduction to both the details and the overall trajectory of a text that continues to reward careful study.

[1] That the methodological precept offered in PA I 5 contains an implicit answer to the question raised in PA I 1 is not a new idea. See, in particular, A. Gotthelf, “Division and Explanation in PA,” in H.-C. Günther and A. Rengakos (eds.) Beiträge zur antiken Philosophie. Festschrift für Wolfgang Kullmann (Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 1997): 215-230 (reprinted in A. Gotthelf, Teleology, First Principles, and Scientific Method in Aristotle’s Biology [Oxford: Oxford University Press 2012]: 197-214). Surprisingly enough, this article is not discussed by Tipton and is not listed in the bibliography.

[2] I am using an expression coined by Jim Lennox. See J. G. Lennox, “Aristotle’s Norms of Inquiry,” in HOPOS: The Journal of the International Society for the History of Science1 (2011): 23-46.

[3] I say “explicit” because most of the relevant literature is cited in the bibliography.

[4] For how this explanatory concern shapes and controls the whole study of animals, I refer the reader to J. G. Lennox, “Divide and Explain: The Posterior Analytics in Practice,” in A. Gotthelf and J. G. Lennox, Philosophical Issues in Aristotle’s Biology (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987), 90-119 (reprinted in J. G. Lennox, Aristotle’s Philosophy of Biology [Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001]: 7-38). For an application of this methodological concern to the study conducted in the PA, see the article by Allan Gotthelf cited in footnote 1.

[5] The following translations of the PA have been published in recent years: A. Carbone, Aristotele: Le parti degli animali (Milano: Biblioteca Universale Rizzoli, 2002), W. Kullmann, Aristoteles: Über die Teile der Lebewesen (Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2007), P. Pellegrin, Aristote: Les parties des animaux (Paris: Flammarion 2011), and F. Gain,Aristote: Les parties des animaux (Paris: Le Livre de Poche, 2011).