Philosophical Delusion and its Therapy: Outline of a Philosophical Revolution

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Eugen Fischer, Philosophical Delusion and its Therapy: Outline of a Philosophical Revolution, Routledge, 2010, 320pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415331791.

Reviewed by Anat Biletzki, Quinnipiac University and Tel Aviv University


Putting the words "philosophy" and "therapy" together immediately brings to mind Wittgenstein. And, indeed, it is the therapeutic reading of Wittgenstein's later philosophy -- but also, according to a leading brand of therapeutic readers, the early Wittgenstein's -- that has become a mainstay in the interpretative industry surrounding Wittgenstein.  It is a mainstay as in being popular almost to the point of consensus, but also as leading to vigorous disagreement and debate. What is clear, it seems, to all on both sides of the interpretative domain, is that "therapy" is used metaphorically, even if earnestly: philosophy -- traditional, classical philosophy -- is an ailment, and good philosophy -- revolutionary philosophy as Wittgenstein would have us do it -- is therapy for the ailment. In no sense does one believe that medical, scientific, or even clinical psychological therapy is in play here. Rather, interpreters of Wittgenstein engage themselves in locating what might go wrong (what would be a "sickness") in the doing of philosophy and how it could be set aright (after "therapy") with the right kind of philosophy.

The book under review takes therapy seriously, refusing to think of it as a metaphor for anything. (It does, however, take metaphor itself to task as one of the main causes of philosophical illness. I'll get to that shortly.) Quite astoundingly, we encounter here the idea (and its meticulous working out) that both therapy and illness are scientifically recognizable; that, therefore, there is a type of philosophical illness -- literally -- that can be diagnosed; and that therapeutic philosophy is then to be discovered and implemented -- literally -- in order to cure the disease. In a completely original move, Eugen Fischer puts together, causally and logically, the sciences of cognitive linguistics, cognitive and social psychology, and even clinical psychology on the one hand, and philosophy on the other.

This is not the familiar intuition that certain subjects, such as semantics, syntax, cognition, and innumerable others, appear both in linguistics/psychology and in philosophy and that the disciplines stand to profit by learning from each other. No, the relationship is far deeper and more intricate: research and investigations in linguistics and psychology are precisely the theoretical and data-driven underpinnings that serve us in locating philosophical problems and their solutions. Philosophy, in Fischer's hands, has come a long way from being a -- merely -- conceptual questioning of a priori analysis. (In that he is surely in line with current philosophical mores like experimental philosophy or cognitive studies; but that is a different complaint.) And Fischer has taken one more gargantuan step by generalizing this discovery to the history of philosophy. In other words, his fascinating construal of philosophical problems as based on linguistic and psychological mistakes functions as a general structure which he identifies in several perennial, long-standing philosophical subjects, such as mind-body, perception, qualia, etc. Truth be told, he does not claim that such a basic form characterizes all philosophical problems, but enough of these staples of philosophy do fall under his meta-diagnosis to make it either capaciously explanatory or intensely troubling.

These ideas are so provocative that it behooves us to follow Fischer systematically to see how he brings about a proof, so to speak, of his hypothesis. Philosophical problems arise because philosophers are in the grip of philosophical pictures; these philosophical pictures are the result of misapplied metaphors, or of inferences arising from these metaphors; therapy, therefore, consists of exposing these pictures and acknowledging that the problems are dissolved if we deny the pictures. Put in such terms one might easily acquiesce to this "hypothesis"; in fact, it might not be a hypothesis at all, but rather a familiar (see Wittgenstein) way of describing, criticizing, and lauding different ways of doing philosophy. Fischer's aim is, however, to show us that these pictures and what we do with them can be introduced, and then analyzed, using linguistic and psychological discoveries. More instructively, the therapy that we can then apply to this dysfunction is not itself a tool of linguistics or psychology but rather a certain type of philosophical practice -- therapeutic philosophy -- the first two (imperfect) paradigms of which Fischer locates in Austin and Wittgenstein. I would call this an attempt at scientific philosophy.


The book has three parts: Philosophical Pictures, Philosophical Delusions, and Therapeutic Philosophy. They seem admirably systematic to begin with: let's see how and why we are tempted into certain pictures which regulate our philosophical dealings, let's understand how and why these pictures are actually delusions, and let's cure ourselves of such delusions. My admiration for this methodically neat treatment of the presentation is constant throughout the book. Fischer never lets go of the orderly building of his argument even though he needs to traverse several different planes while doing so: connecting philosophical concepts to their psychological/linguistic pictures, establishing the fascinating pedigree of these pictures in historical models, relating these histories to current (or at least 20th century) successors, and providing the comprehensive harbingers of therapeutic philosophy in the thought and, more importantly, action of Austin and Wittgenstein.

"Pictures rather than propositions, metaphors rather than statements, determine most of our philosophical convictions" (21). Thus begins the first chapter of the first part of the book; this is the (unsubstantiated, to my mind) claim that drives the whole book. Philosophers are "under the spell of philosophical pictures," such pictures -- actually metaphors and analogies -- now amenable to linguistic and psychological description and analysis thanks to the scientific work recently done in linguistics and psychology. This analysis propels us forward to the errors we make, unintentionally, when our reasoning is based on such pictures. The ultimate example of such a picture is the one bequeathed us by Locke: modern philosophy's conception of the mind as a perceptual space (which holds objects of perception) and as a perceptual organ. This metaphorical conception and the unconscious reasoning based on it is shown by Fischer to be responsible for all those famous issues of modern philosophy that we, in turn, might bequeath to future generations of philosophers: the mind-body problem, substances and accidents, primary and secondary qualities, and all our questions about perception. The complex point made in this first part of the book is elucidatory of all philosophical discussion and doctrine. Faced with ordinary facts (of our senses and our common sense) we become troubled only because we have posited -- unintentionally perhaps -- other "facts"  that are based on our "picture-driven inferences," and this incongruence gives rise to the traditional terminology, issues and problems of philosophy. But the original fact to be explained, the original picture, was actually "a bogus explanandum, suggesting a wild explanation, and providing the premises of what argument is subsequently adduced in its support" (109).

The distance from this culmination of the first part, on philosophical pictures, to philosophical delusions is not far. Just as philosophical pictures were dissected, to begin with, by data and research coming out of linguistics and psychology and showing how we reason -- wrongly -- based on our working out of metaphors and structural analogies, now another scientific, psychological concept is put to work to explain how philosophers -- in this case Berkeley and Ayer -- "maintain doctrines which are absurd, as a matter of delusion." Berkeley's process of argumentation is played out, including several fallacies, such as the fallacy of question begging ("Assuming the Conclusion"), and the psychological construct of belief bias. Ayer's arguments for sense-data are similarly explained, using both linguistic and psychological explication. But both of these are directed toward one thing -- the exposure of their doctrines as, in the final analysis, delusional. "Contrary to common prejudice, people with delusional beliefs may be capable of reasoned argument and sensible behavior" (88). Indeed, Fischer uses the DSM's definition of delusion, argues with it, and supplies us, instead, with "A belief is delusional to the extent to which it is absurd and strongly persistent" (190). He continues down the psychological path, elaborating on mental illnesspathologyemotional problemsbehavioral problems, and others -- all intended to show that philosophical reflection, shaped by philosophical pictures, is a disease. No wonder, then, that we then have a

call for something that is literally a therapy, in philosophy: The ideal of health of which we fall short when we agonise over picture-raised problems is the same ideal of rational autonomy of which people fall short when suffering from exemplary mental disorders: When falling short of it, philosophers are ill in a different way than, but in the same sense as people suffering from depression or psychosis. Their key symptoms are beliefs which literally qualify as delusions, and the autonomous cognitive process to which they are due satisfies a strict definition of the term 'disease' (201).

The third part of the book is almost to be expected. After we have identified the causes of philosophical illness and its manifestations (both in theory and historical example), it is encouraging, even inspiring, to see that therapy for the disease is to be found in philosophy itself as well. This call for therapeutic philosophy is reasonably executed. It involves, naturally and necessarily, both a "meta-philosophical" turn and a "therapeutic" turn -- both telling us, from on high (or is it from below, i.e., from science?), what it is that we do, and should do, when doing philosophy. In the chapter called "Linguistic Analysis as Therapy," Austin's turn to language, in order to disabuse philosophers of the need to address unanswerable questions and problems so as to "put an end to unwarranted feelings of intellectual unease and disquiet, that is, to solve a specific emotional problem," is lauded. As is, of course, Wittgenstein's more far-reaching dissolution of the problems -- attributed not only to a linguistic turn, but also to Wittgenstein's targeting of his own, rather than others' disquiet; this is a matter of self-diagnosis and self-understanding -- in other words, self-therapy.


Why, then, do I entertain a certain disquiet, both in my reading and in my reporting? My main worry is about two substantive, principled and not unrelated concerns: the meeting place of science and philosophy and the focus on meta-philosophy. Fischer concludes his final chapter:

We can move beyond such simple experiments . . . to scientific experiment. We may, in particular, turn to experimental work from those parts of cognitive science that are not excessively speculative . . . such findings become a powerful tool of philosophical criticism -- including self-criticism (275).

He is well-meaning. He views experimental work in linguistics and psychology as providing us with explications of philosophical reflection, diagnoses of philosophical angst, and, most importantly, the road to solutions, or mostly dissolutions, of philosophical problems; this last point is meta-philosophy insisting that philosophy be therapeutic philosophy. I dare venture that that is not what Wittgenstein meant, or did, when he turned to "therapy." We might view the Wittgensteinian appeal to therapy as associative in the manner of Freud (and psychoanalysis), or as autobiographically self-descriptive of his own methodology. We might accept the "New" Wittgensteinian "understanding of Wittgenstein as aspiring, not to advance metaphysical theories, but rather to help us work ourselves out of confusions we become entangled in when philosophizing" (see Alice Crary in the Introduction to The New Wittgenstein).  But from any of these standpoints -- and even when we focus on therapy as dealing with a philosopher, not with a philosophical problem -- never do we lose sight of the philosophy on account of the meta-philosophy. For Wittgenstein the two are interwoven.

I dare worry, without being facetious, that there is a mixing of metaphors -- metaphor as a linguistic phenomenon and metaphor as a misleading philosophical tool -- in Fischer's suggestions. And I dare insist on the place of philosophy as untouched by linguistic or psychological experiment. Yes, Austin gave us a way of looking at and through language in doing things with words while doing philosophy; and Wittgenstein went even further -- in that I agree with Fischer -- in admonishing us to decry theory and explanation while using therapeutic philosophy to calm the longing for philosophical peace. But there's the rub: Fischer adopts both scientific theory and explanation in his version of therapeutic philosophy, using them as evidence for his exclusive meta-philosophy. This might be (linguistic or psychological) therapy; I worry that it has abandoned philosophy.