Philosophical Dialectics: An Essay on Metaphilosophy

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Nicholas Rescher, Philosophical Dialectics: An Essay on Metaphilosophy, State University of New York Press, 2006, 120pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 0791467457.

Reviewed by Stephen Hetherington, University of New South Wales


The topic of this brief book by Nicholas Rescher is one to which, I suspect, many philosophers accord insufficient attention -- namely, philosophical progress. What is it? How achievable is it? Rescher is remarkably well-placed to report on far-flung boundaries and buried details of philosophy's historical and conceptual domain; which is what he does here, albeit somewhat gesturally. He identifies various features of how, inevitably, philosophy proceeds; and he draws implications as to how philosophical claims are therefore limited in what knowledge they can supply.

Here are some details of Rescher's thinking.

For him, philosophy is always a practice, a back-and-forth of considered positions on fundamental questions. Always, that back-and-forth is guided by methodological meta-principles bearing upon "informative adequacy" (pp. 3-5), "rational cogency" (pp. 5-7), and "rational economy" (pp. 7-10). These are unavoidable for good philosophy. They do not "merely reflect the presumptions and predilections of a place and time" (p. 11). This is due to "the purposive nature of philosophy as the discipline it is":

the aim of the enterprise is to resolve in a convincing way our big questions regarding reality and our place within it. And … [these principles'] requirements reflect conditions under which alone the aims of the philosophical enterprise can be realized in an efficient and effective way. It is this serviceability for the very goal structure of the enterprise that endows those philosophical principles with their unconditional cogency. (ibid.)

And how are those principles implemented within philosophy? Aporetically! Even individual philosophers, it seems, incur this predicament: "generally the answers that people incline to give to some questions are incompatible with those they incline to give to others" (p. 17). We strike our toes on "cognitive dissonance" (ibid.), on "puzzlement and perplexity" (ibid.). Aporiai arise. ("An aporia is a group of contentions that are individually plausible but collectively inconsistent" (ibid.)) Socrates would be proud of his legacy.

Examples abound, and Rescher mentions several -- starting with ones about virtue, knowledge, meaning, explanation, and the problem of evil. How should a philosopher react to these aporiai? Precisely as philosophers do react:

one can … become a skeptic, and walk away from the entire issue, or else one can settle down to the work of problem solving, trying to salvage what one can by way of cognitive damage control… . (p. 19)

There is a philosophically typical way of reacting. We posit distinctions, talking of two senses of X, say. This should involve skill. We need to avoid formal flaws of distinction (imprecision, nonexclusivity, or nonexhaustiveness, (p. 30)) and material flaws of distinction or application (vacuity, triviality, or pointlessness, pp. 30-1). If we do avoid such failings, there are two results (p. 24). (1) We retain whatever was plausible in our concept of X (by adopting new concepts, of X1 and of X2). (2) We thereby make philosophy more complicated. Is (2) a failing? Rescher does not seem to believe so.

If anything, we do not make our philosophical thinking complex enough:

the world's complexity is such that we are never able to achieve a perfect fit here, because the world's phenomena are so complex and variegated that there will always be problem cases that just do not fit smoothly into the concepts and patterns that characterize the general run of things. And so, in their striving for maximum generality the generalizations of philosophy are virtually always overgeneralizations involving a certain amount of oversimplification. (p. 36)

We seek generality when theorizing about a domain; yet always there is associated complexity which we have not represented accurately. We must distinguish this from that, then this-this from that-this, and so on -- delving ever deeper into the domain, perpetually describing new distinctions.

The result is not merely a series of distinctions, though. Rescher accords philosophy a Hegelian nature (p. 39): even as there are distinctions, there is synthesis. Distinctions preserve, even as they discard; and philosophy thrives:

Their grounding in aporetic conflicts provides philosophical controversies with a natural structure that endows their problem areas with an organic unity. (p. 43)

Such "systemic interrelatedness" (p. 51) is vital, in Rescher's view. Would our explaining the existence of individual parts of some philosophical whole thereby explain that philosophical whole? No, because philosophical understanding is not merely aggregative; a philosophical sense of a structured whole as such is needed.

How does Rescher argue for this crucial thesis? He proceeds via key examples of what he calls "constructivist metaphysics" (p. 54) -- logical atomism, process atomism, epistemic or cognitive atomism (Carnap and the Vienna Circle), and action-theoretic atomism. Such representative philosophical movements strive to resolve what is complex into what is absolutely simple. But this always fails. First, there is no absolute simplicity: "There just may not be an atomistic end of the line" (p. 61). Second, even comparative simplicity is not an absolute phenomenon: there is only comparative simplicity in some respect. At best, we may assess X as being simpler than Y in respect Z.

Those methodological claims by Rescher are intended to cohere with this fundamental metaphysical one: "the universe is a cosmos -- an ordered structure" (p. 65). Correlatively, we "must be holistic and systemic if we are to succeed in dealing adequately with the inherent complexities of the issues" (p. 66). Again, therefore, we encounter the theme of inescapable complexity; and again we struggle: being systemic has costs. A welcome epistemological stance might have unwelcome ethical implications (pp. 67-8); a plausible thesis in semantics could have awkward metaphysical reverberations (pp. 68-70); and the like. Rescher's earlier theme of philosophy's aporetic nature thus returns:

the realm of truth is unified, and its components are interlinked. Change your mind regarding one fact about the real, and you cannot leave all the rest unaffected. To qualify as adequate, one's account of things must be a systemic whole whose components are interrelated by relation of systemic interaction or feedback. In the final analysis, philosophy is a system, because it is concerned to indicate, or at least to estimate, the truth about things, and 'the truth about reality' is a system. (pp. 71-2)

No philosophical thesis is an island, entire unto itself. Always, what is at stake are philosophical systems; and none are perfect. So much so, indeed, that:

In philosophy there is an ever-renewed need for further refinements and extensions. We arrive at the fundamental law of philosophical development: Any given philosophical position, at any particular stage in its development, will, if developed further, encounter inconsistencies. (p. 81)

There is a profound motivational implication in this line of thought. The continually increasing complexity in our philosophical efforts moves us "ever further from the simpler presystemic issues that afford the starting point of our philosophical deliberations" (pp. 86-7). Philosophers cease being able to communicate with non-philosophers about philosophy. We lose ourselves in philosophical details. Indeed, those details become lost themselves, as the subject continues being developed (pp. 88-9). At best (if remembered at all), those various details will be just part of the subject's history, as philosophy marches remorselessly onwards. The trek cannot stop with a philosophically final word.

Having said that, perhaps there is a limit to how many new styles are available:

philosophizing is not a matter of transiently all-embracing styles but of ever-recurrent doctrines…. Overall, what we have in philosophy is not the evolution of consensus but continuing controversy. (pp. 89-90)

Details will change, although "The basic problems always remain in place, firmly rooted in some fundamental element of the human condition." (p. 91)

That "human condition" generates recurrent concerns -- and it suffers recurrent limitations. Rescher ends with epistemological thoughts on the scope of philosophical knowledge. Are there unknowable facts? At any time, yes. Are there unanswerable questions? At any moment, yes. How many are there? We cannot know:

mapping the realm of what is knowable as such is something that inevitably is beyond our powers. And for this reason any questions about the cognitive completeness of our present knowledge are and will remain inexorably unresolvable. (p. 106)

Accordingly, Rescher offers this parting thought: "We simply cannot make a reliable assessment of the extent of our ignorance." (p. 107)

So, there we have it: an overview (simultaneously analytic and synthetic) of some significant characteristics of philosophical inquiry, with various of Rescher's own distinctive philosophical themes on display -- the pragmatic evaluation of a process of dialectical systematizing, adverting to fallibility, coherence, holism, and conceptual limitations. This is a slim book with an extensive vision. What lessons should we take from it?

Rescher is right about the prevailing presence of aporiai within philosophy as a whole: in practice, philosophy is powered by such conflicts. It is not clear, however, whether his observations accurately reflect all areas of philosophy at all moments: is every philosopher perpetually mired in aporiai? Maybe not -- although maybe he or she should be. This is a significant qualification: insightful work can be needed if one is to discover an inconsistency constitutive of a given apory. Philosophical progress might be required even to develop the respective philosophical positions sufficiently to enable them to clash with each other.

Moreover, suppose that the world ends just before some specific inconsistency, regarding a particular topic T, was about to be noticed. In that event, must there have been no philosophical progress regarding T? Surely not; in which case, philosophical progress is not dependent upon the actual production of aporiai. At best, therefore, there is idealizing in this aspect of Rescher's picture.

And even if, for argument's sake, we grant him that idealization, a problem remains. As we saw, Rescher describes philosophy as reaching for distinctions in response to aporiai. From a particular aporetic concept X will emerge two new concepts, X1 and X2, with each of these having some plausibility -- some apparent likelihood of becoming part of an improved philosophical system. But can plausibility be sliced too finely -- 'divided' too many times? For Rescher, philosophy's underlying aim is to answer basic questions. We might describe these as having a philosophically undivided (because fundamental) significance for us. Correlatively, if we could answer those questions correctly, our answers would have a similarly undivided (because fundamental) philosophical plausibility -- in the sense of accurately reporting something of ultimate philosophical significance. These would be 'large' truths. Yet the more we divide our philosophical concepts, the greater the risk of travelling further away from continuing to engage with the fundamental or undividedly significant questions; and the further we stray from providing philosophical answers with fundamental or undivided plausibility. This raises the possibility of there being less and less such plausibility in our philosophical thinking, as the answers -- the distinctions -- become ever finer-grained. It is not that the answers will thereby be false, or even that they are increasingly likely to be false. The failing is that they will report ever 'smaller' truths. More and more, we will be uncovering only truths that matter less and less, philosophically speaking (insofar as the philosophical truths that matter most are the 'large' ones). Philosophical plausibility as such could thereby be lessened: truths might emerge without still being so philosophical.

We would care less and less about any such answers; and therein lies a danger even for philosophy's continued existence. Rescher treats philosophy as an organic entity, a living thing. He dismisses the possibility, whenever the idea arises (such as when skepticism is mentioned), of humans not continuing to philosophize. Yet why should that possibility be treated cavalierly? If the philosophical answers we find ourselves deriving are less and less worth caring about, so too are the associated questions (those that have generated the answers, and those generated by the answers). Is there an absolute "human condition" that includes a drive to philosophize? Although Rescher talks of a human condition, seemingly embodying that urge, I did not notice any argument supporting such talk. Maybe it was only due to a psychological quirk, a lucky historical accident, that people ever began philosophizing. If we do philosophy badly, or in ways that matter less and less to more and more of us, why shouldn't people quite appropriately turn away from it? (Maybe those who do not turn away would stay from weakness, not strength. Could philosophical urges ever become akin to a nervous mental tic?) Once again, Rescher's approach seems to involve a substantial element of idealization.

I expect that the book's parting thought is correct -- that we cannot know exactly how ignorant we are in general, and that this is so even if we can have knowledge. Still, I would have liked to see Rescher discuss this more fully. For example, he might have considered whether any knowledge we do have is weakened in quality by our not knowing how much of the world it reveals. After all, this latter lack of meta-knowledge is our not knowing what systemic role, within all of the knowledge that in principle could be attained about the world, is played by the knowledge we do have. In this sense, we do not know how systemically -- thus, how fully or deeply -- we know even whatever we do know.

Not only that; if we cannot know exactly how ignorant we are, should Rescher be so confident that our philosophical thinking is never sufficiently complex? We would also not know exactly how knowledgeable we are; maybe we are more knowledgeable than we believe. The fact that our philosophical thinking may continually become more complex, for instance, is hardly conclusive evidence that it ought to do so. Rescher owes us a more complex argument here.

Nonetheless, his book has many pleasing features. It is clearly written, and it addresses metaphilosophical questions that many philosophers shirk. These questions bear even upon the point of doing philosophy. Is the book therefore a significant contribution to philosophy? In one sense, yes -- because it is imaginative and bold. In another sense, no -- because its brevity sacrifices many needed details and because the examples provided will not surprise professional philosophers. In another sense, though, the book could be useful: I can easily imagine setting parts of it for students who ask about philosophical method and philosophy's epistemic prospects.

But the book does have a relevant problem, one that was easily avoidable. If ever a book seems not to have been copyedited and proof-read, it is this one. Typographical errors abound, including many glaring mistakes. I do not recall more of them, ever, in a serious philosophy book: approximately every second page contains one. Almost inexplicably, too, some entire passages appear twice within the book. A short paragraph from p. 31 recurs on p. 35; p. 78 repeats material from pp. 38-9; pp. 79-80 reprise, with a few trivial changes, a passage from p. 39 (oddly, the later appearance corrects a substantive typographical mistake from the earlier one); much of p. 80 all-but-repeats some of pp. 37-8; and a paragraph on p. 40 occurs again, with minimal alteration, on p. 81. That is not all: p. 103 quotes a lengthy passage from Peirce (referencing it cursorily in n. 10, on p. 113) which also appears in n.6 (appearing on p. 113); pp. 104-5 feature a passage used at pp. 97-8; this is followed immediately, on p. 105, by a few sentences from p. 99.

I do not know what to make of all of that, other than to be perplexed.

Let's not end this review on that odd note; here is my more satisfied reaction. All philosophers can learn from Rescher's vast body of work, the grand sweep of his philosophical experience and vision -- characteristics that also animate this book. For anyone who wishes to think philosophically about philosophy as a whole, Rescher's book is a useful and engaging place to begin. There is metaphilosophical wisdom in it.