Philosophical Essays, Volume 1: Natural Language: What It Means and How We Use It

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Scott Soames, Philosophical Essays, Volume 1: Natural Language: What It Means and How We Use It, Princeton UP, 2008, 428 pp., $39.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780691136813.

Reviewed by Gary Ostertag, The Saul Kripke Center, The Graduate Center, CUNY



The present work, together with its companion volume,1 collects almost all of Scott Soames’s major papers. That such a collection would be a major contribution to the philosophy of language is a foregone conclusion — Soames’s work is widely read, widely discussed, and has exerted an enormous influence in this area. Scrutinizing the volumes makes clear why this is so: while the essays are characterized by an unusually high level of rigor, providing a model of careful, probing philosophical argumentation, they are always guided by a keen awareness of the larger issues.

The volume is thoughtfully organized and includes an informative but concise introduction. Potential readers should be forewarned, however: the essays are written to advance the discussion in a particular area and not, in general, to guide the novice through the rigors of philosophical semantics. They range over a number of related issues: presupposition (Part One), knowledge of language (Part Two), the semantics-pragmatics divide (Part Three), Russell’s theory of descriptions (Part Four) and, as a sort of coda, the theory of legal interpretation (Part Five).

One theme running through many of the essays concerns the relation between the study of the syntax and semantics of natural languages and the study of the competent speaker’s knowledge of language. In Essays Three and Four, Soames argues for a sharp demarcation between the two; he goes on to claim (in Essay Five) that knowledge of a meaning theory for a language is neither necessary nor sufficient for understanding that language. This methodological orientation dovetails with the work he is perhaps most well known for, defending and elaborating the theory of direct reference — a theory notoriously at variance with speakers’ intuitions. While the recent work collected in Part Three modifies the direct reference approach, bringing it in line with ordinary intuitions, the framework Soames here adopts is in keeping with his earlier methodology. As we shall see, while the current approach is more faithful to speakers’ judgments about truth conditions, the relation between what a sentence says, what a speaker asserts in uttering it, and what she also may thereby implicate or presuppose, remains “intricate, complex and nontransparent”.

In this review, I will focus on Soames’s recent conversion to a form of Contextualism, examining its application to puzzling contexts involving proper names, to the theory of descriptions, and to problems in legal interpretation. I then turn to his very interesting recent discussion of foundational questions concerning the nature of propositions. I will ignore, for reasons of space, his influential treatment of presupposition, equally important work on knowledge of language, and his penetrating critique of Davidsonian semantics.

1. Pragmatic Enrichment

Belief Reports and Simple Sentences

Prior to his 2002 volume, Beyond Rigidity, Soames espoused the then-prevailing account of the relation between what a speaker asserts, or says,2 in uttering a sentence S, and the semantic content of S — what S says. This can be summarized as follows:

What a speaker says in uttering a sentence S (relative to the context of utterance C) just is the semantic content of S in C (that is, what S says in C).3

Any aspects of speaker meaning going beyond the assertion of S‘s semantic content would be explained by appeal to independently-needed pragmatic principles of the sort sketched by Paul Grice. But in Beyond Rigidity Soames came to recognize what Contextualists such as Robyn Carston, François Recanati, Dan Sperber and Deirdre Wilson had been stressing for some time: what a speaker says (as opposed to what she merely implicates) in uttering a sentence S will in many cases go beyond what S says. To use now-familiar terminology, in such cases a process of free enrichment takes place: the minimal content that a semantic theory assigns to a sentence S will be supplemented by contextual factors. The process is “free” in the sense that it is unconstrained by S’s grammatical form.4

An oft-cited example of this phenomenon involves genitive constructions, such as ’Ada’s book’. In uttering ‘I enjoyed reading Ada’s book’ I can say a number of distinct things (although typically not at the same time): that I enjoyed reading the book Ada wrote, reading the book Ada bought, reading the book Ada edited, etc. Moreover, there seems to be no minimal content common to each completing proposition — at least, nothing one can plausibly be said to assert. Contextualists maintain that what I said in uttering this sentence is not to be identified with the semantic content of the sentence — for the simple reason that the semantic content, not being a full proposition, is not something that I can say or assert. In addition, even when the minimal content p of a sentence S is fully propositional, it may still not count as being said by an utterance of S (this would be the case when, due to its irrelevance, obvious falsity, etc., asserting p fails to further the purpose of the conversation).

It’s worth tracing Soames’s path to the Contextualism of Beyond Rigidity and its subsequent modifications (the Introduction and essays in Parts Three, Four and Five develop this model further, and provide a number of illuminating applications as well). Here’s a thumbnail sketch.

Along with Nathan Salmon, Soames has been one of the main proponents of a directly referential treatment of proper names, indexicals and demonstratives. On the direct reference (or “naïve”) theory the semantic content of a simple sentence of the form (1) is a structured entity containing the respective semantic values of the singular term ‘Superman’ and the predicate ‘can fly’, arranged in a way that mirrors the sentence’s surface grammar.

(1) Superman can fly.

In assertively uttering (1), a speaker says or asserts this entity, which, following convention, I’ll represent as (1a):

(1a) <Superman, the capacity to fly><superman,>


The naïve approach has notoriously unintuitive consequences. To see this, consider its application to (2):

(2) Clark isn’t Superman.

(2a) <<<superman,><Superman, Superman>, Identity>, NEG>5


If we assume that identity is necessary (and we indulge in the Superman fiction), (2a) is a metaphysically impossible proposition. But then we have a question: how could it be that otherwise rational Lois is asserting something tantamount to Superman is not Superman?

According to Soames, what Lois says in uttering (2) is in fact a free enrichment of (2a), something that be rendered more colloquially by (2b) (which, in turn, can be represented by the description sentence (2c)):

(2b) Superman, the reporter, is not Superman, the superhero.

(2c) [the x: x = Superman & Reporter(x)] [the y: y = Superman & Superhero(y)] (x y)

We thus capture the intuition that what Lois says in uttering (2) is perfectly coherent.

But Soames now recognizes a problem with this suggestion. Since (2a) is nonetheless the semantic content of (2), doesn’t Lois in uttering (2) also assert the absurdity, (2a)? Circa Beyond Rigidity, Soames’s verdict would be that Lois does assert (2a) — even though neither she nor her audience will recognize her as saying something necessarily false. But (as Essays Nine and Ten of the current volume suggest), reflecting on cases like (2) seems to have pushed Soames to reject this aspect of the Beyond Rigidity framework, bringing him into closer harmony with Contextualists, who deny that one who utters S to assert an enrichment of S‘s minimal semantic content must also assert the minimal content as well.6

Soames’s analysis of free enrichment as it applies to simple sentences extends quite smoothly to the semantics of belief reports. Assume that Mary, just as in the dark regarding Superman’s secret identity as Lois Lane, utters (3):

(3) Lois knows that Clark isn’t Superman.

If we take Mary to be asserting (3a), then we construe her as asserting that Lois knows a necessary falsehood; more plausible is the suggestion that Mary asserts (3b):

(3a) Lois knows that Superman isn’t Superman.

(3b) Lois knows that Superman, the reporter, is not Superman, the superhero.

(3a) is the semantic content of (3) — what the sentence (3) says; (3b) is an example of what an ordinary speaker might say in uttering (3b). Once again, there is no reason to maintain that a speaker such as Mary asserts (3a) merely in virtue of asserting the richer (3b). (Of course, a speaker who asserts an enrichment of the semantic content of S is not thereby precluded from asserting its minimal content as well. If S‘s minimal content is mutually recognized by speaker and hearer to be a consequence of the enriched proposition — and if it isn’t a manifest absurdity — then it will also count as being asserted.)

Before proceeding, it’s worth pointing out how Soames’s approach preserves some of the spirit of the (unmodified) naïve theory he had previously endorsed. On his current view, the semantic content of S — what a semantic theory assigns to S — operates as a “constraint” on use. This constraint is operative in every assertoric utterance of S; it functions as “the least common denominator” of all acts of speaker meaning consisting in the assertoric utterance of S. However, there is no need to go the extra mile and maintain that any such utterance is also an assertion of S‘s semantic content. Previously, it was thought that the unenriched semantic content of S would function as both a constraint on the use of S and as what one asserts in uttering S. But Soames now holds that these notions can be teased apart.

This move suggests to Soames a reconciliation of Fregean and Millian insights about names: "Although Kripke was right that the meanings of [linguistically simple] names are thoroughly nondescriptive, Frege was right that we often use sentences containing them to make assertions, and express beliefs, that are, in part, descriptive" (283; emphasis in text). Soames thus retains a naïve approach to the semantic contents of (e.g.) (1) and ’Lois believes that Superman can fly’ while at the same time acknowledging that these sentences can be used to say something richer than their semantically-determined contents.

While Soames makes a compelling case for a Contextualist approach to the assertoric contents of simple sentences and belief reports, it remains to be asked whether his specific treatment gets the facts right with respect to these contexts. Before proceeding, however, I wish to point out an unresolved tension deriving from Soames’s dual commitments to Contextualism and the naïve theory.

Soames writes that two speakers who associate entirely different descriptive properties with the name “Bill Clinton” can nonetheless still communicate with one another and thus, presumably, be mutually understood — so long as they each assign the same referent to the name (405). But this cannot generally be true. Let’s assume that Sam utters ‘Clinton is a Democrat,’ intending to assert that Clinton, the ex-President, is a Democrat, but that Chloe, although assigning the correct referent to the name, fails to associate the relevant property with it, thus failing to grasp the intended enrichment. According to Soames, Chloe nonetheless understands Sam’s utterance, since she assigns the correct referent to ‘Clinton’ — even though she fails to grasp what he asserts. (She either construes Sam as asserting the sentence’s minimal content, or as asserting an enrichment that he did not intend — e.g., that Clinton, the husband of Hillary, is a Democrat.)

As indicated, this exposes a tension in Soames’s approach. It is a cornerstone of the anti-descriptivist tradition stemming from Kripke’s Naming and Necessity that understanding a name, and thus a simple sentence containing it, does not require thinking of the referent of the name in any particular way, or associating a particular property with it. However, this bit of wisdom appears to be incompatible with Soames’s Contextualism. After all, on Soames’s view, we regularly assert “descriptive enrichments” of singular propositions. And it would seem that understanding these assertions will require grasping the intended enrichments.

One obvious resolution is to acknowledge that understanding Sam’s utterance does indeed require grasping the intended enrichment. This is a reasonable concession, especially since Soames is committed to the naïve theory only insofar as it relates to the semantic contents of sentences containing simple names. This commitment leaves open what we are to say about Sam — whether he asserted the above-mentioned enrichment, or whether he merely asserted its minimal content.7

We now turn to the question, whether Soames’s approach provides an adequate treatment of assertoric contents of simple sentences and belief reports. I’ll mention two problems.

First, it is unclear how to extend the proposal to cases such as the following. Suppose that Sam is unaware that being a dog just is being a canine. To make things convenient for philosophers of language, he says things like: ‘Dogs, but not canines, are domestic animals.’ Moreover, he believes that his pet Fido is a dog and not a canine. Mary takes him at his word and utters the following:

(4) Sam believes that Fido is a dog.

(5) Sam disbelieves that Fido is a canine.

Does Mary attribute contradictory beliefs to Sam? It hardly seems so. Yet, although Soames can handle cases such as (3),8 his own implementation of the free enrichment strategy does not extend in any obvious way to (4). For example, we might take (4)‘s semantic content to be captured by the proposition-matrix (4a), (5)’s by (5a):

(4a) <<<fido,><Fido, <doghood>, ___>, Sam>, Belief>


(5a) <<<fido,><Fido, <dodghood>, ___>, Sam>, Disbelief>


But it’s hard to get clear on what a completion of (4a) or (5a) would be. In the case of (2), we are provided with both a colloquial expression of its completion, namely, (2b), and a characterization of its completion in first-order logic, namely, (2c); neither is available in the case of (4a)/(5a).

It might seem that a solution to this problem within Soames’s overall framework is readily available. Given, as we have seen, that the semantic value of a singular term such as a proper name can be enriched at the context of utterance, it seems plausible to hold that the semantic value of a ‘that’-clause can be enriched as well. (After all, for Soames, ‘that’-clauses function as singular terms.) If so, there seems no principled barrier to holding that what Mary says in uttering (4) is (4b) and that what she says in uttering (5) is (5b):

(4b) <<<<fido,><Fido, doghood>, being F>, Sam>, Belief>


(5b) <<<<Fido, doghood><fido,>, being H>, Sam>, Disbelief>


Here, being F is a property a proposition <a, G> has just in case just in case G is true of domestic animals, while being H is a property <a, G> has just in case just in case G is true of wild animals. Construed thus, Sam’s rationality is no longer threatened by Mary’s reports: according to the above, he does not believe and disbelieve one and the same proposition.

While no natural English paraphrase suggests itself, (4b) and (5b) enjoy straightforward description-theoretic renderings:

(4c) [the p: p = <fido,> <</fido,>Fido, doghood> & F<fido,>(</fido,>p)] (Sam believes p)

(5c) [the p: p = <fido,> </fido,><fido,><</fido,>Fido, doghood> <fido,>& H(</fido,>p)] (Sam disbelieves p)

Unfortunately, these reveal a problem with the suggestion. (4c)/(5c) entail (4d)/(5d):

(4d) Sam believes <fido,><</fido,>Fido, doghood><fido,>


(5d) Sam disbelieves <fido,><</fido,>Fido, doghood><fido,>


So, while Mary doesn’t necessarily assert that Sam believes and disbelieves one and the same proposition, this is a trivial consequence of what she does assert.

In fact, while one might deny that Mary in asserting (4c)/(5c) necessarily asserts (4d)/(5d), this would be difficult to sustain, since the latter pair trivially follow from the former. Given his other commitments, there is considerable pressure for Soames to claim that she does assert the entailments. He holds that an utterance counting as an assertion of the proposition that A & B "also counts as an assertion of both the proposition that A and the proposition that B." He extends this point to a case similar to (4c)/(5c): in asserting (6) a speaker asserts "of Hillary Clinton that she both is a senator and represents New York, which includes asserting that she represents New York" (261; emphasis added). What she asserts is given by (6a), (relative to an assignment of Hillary Clinton to ‘y’):

(6) Senator Clinton represents New York.

(6a) [the x: x is a senator & x = y] (x represents New York)

Applied to the current case, this would mean that in asserting (4c), Mary asserts, of the proposition <fido,><</fido,>Fido, doghood><fido,>, both that it is F and that Sam believes it, which includes asserting that Sam believes it. Similarly for (5c).


However the issue is resolved, a deeper problem remains. Suppose that Jill isn’t up to date regarding astronomical discoveries — she hasn’t yet learned that Hesperus and Phosphorus are identical. Suppose, also, that although the property of being a planet just is the property of being a spherically-shaped celestial body orbiting a star,9 Jill is unaware of this fact. If so, then nothing blocks Jill from uttering (7) fully intending to convey, not its minimal content (7a), but the enrichment (7b):

(7) Hesperus isn’t Phosphorus.

(7a) <<<Venus, Venus><venus,>, Identity>, NEG>


(7b) <<<<Venus, planet><venus,>, </venus,><venus,><venus,><Venus, spherically-shaped-celestial-body-orbiting-a-star>>, Identity>, NEG>


But, given our assumption, (7b) is no more consistent than (7a) itself. So Jill, asserts not something merely factually false, but absurd. Of course, we could further enrich (7b), pairing the respective occurrences of being a planet (a.k.a., being a spherically-shaped celestial body orbiting a star) with second-order properties of planetary properties. But, even setting aside the rank implausibility of such a move, it has no chance of succeeding even on its own terms, since with a little ingenuity a similar case can be created for enrichments involving second-order properties.

If this consideration is on the right track, it is at best doubtful that the Fregean insight that the propositions we assert when using proper names have descriptive content can be married to the Kripkean insight that the meaning of a proper name is just its referent — at least, not in the way Soames envisions.

But an alternative way of reconciling these insights suggests itself.10 Rather than contextually supplementing the semantic value of, say, ‘Superman’ with a property, as in (2b), we might be forced to supplement it with a way of thinking, or guise, of Superman. The suggestion is far from unproblematic, but at least it would address the concerns outlined above.11

Definite Descriptions

In Essays Ten and Fourteen Soames invokes pragmatic enrichment to defend Russell’s theory of definite descriptions, according to which ‘the F is G’ enjoys the following quantificational analysis:

(8) [the x: Fx] (Gx)

Where (8) is true just in case something is both G and uniquely F.

One important challenge to Russell’s theory comes from the phenomenon of incomplete descriptions.12 The description ‘the guy’ is incomplete relative to a context C just in case there are multiple males at C. A consequence of Russell’s theory is that, if ‘the guy’ is incomplete at C, then (9) will be false when evaluated at C.

(9) The guy’s drunk.

This is, of course, counterintuitive — to the ordinary speaker, a literal utterance of this sentence is not rendered false merely by the existence of more than one male at the context. Since Russell’s theory fails to capture the intuitive data, it must fail as an analysis of sentences exemplifying ‘the F is G.’ So, at any rate, goes the challenge.

On Soames’s view, Mary, in uttering (9), asserts something richer than its minimal Russellian content, (9a):

(9a) [the x: Male(x)] (x is drunk)

What she asserts is a completion of the proposition-matrix, (9b) — for example (9c):

(9b) [the x: Male(x) & ___(x)] (x is drunk)

(9c) [the x: Male(x) & x just stepped on my foot] (x is drunk)

On a flat-footed application of Russell’s theory, Mary, in asserting a completion of (9c) also asserts (9)‘s minimal Russellian content, (9a), even though this aspect of her utterance goes under everyone’s radar. But Soames denies this: while (9a) functions as a constraint on uses of (9), it need not be asserted by each and every use of (9).

Restricting our discussion for the moment to those cases in which Mary uses (9) referentially — to attribute drunkenness to a given individual, say Ferdinand — there are problems with the idea that my use of (9) is enriched in the manner indicated. First, the Russellian seems to misidentify the primary purpose of Mary’s utterance — which is to convey the proposition (9d).

(9d) Ferdinand is drunk.

Traditionally, the Russellian has responded that this proposition is merely implicated, and not asserted, by Mary. But the point is difficult to sustain. Typically, what a speaker implicates is identified only after we have determined what she has said. But, as Stephen Schiffer has pointed out, the order must be reversed in this case. To arrive at an appropriate Russellian completion such as (9c) it seems clear that we must first identify the referent — or, what amounts to the same thing, must first identify the speaker’s intention to convey (9d). Only then can we get to work identifying the intended completion of (9b) (Schiffer, 2005, 1168-9).

In addition, it will rarely be the case that the context will isolate a single completion, such as (9c). Typically, there will be many candidate completions of (9b) — many propositions that are equally plausible candidates for capturing my intention, yet none uniquely so (for example, ‘the guy who just borrowed my cell phone to take a photograph’, ‘the guy who interrupted his lecture with an aside about Lady Gaga’, etc.). This is hard to square with the perceived determinacy of Mary’s utterance of (9). After all, if there is no unique proposition that counts as what she said in uttering (9), then it would seem that her utterance cannot have a determinate content.13

These considerations suggest that descriptions have a semantically significant referential use, in addition to the quantificational use that Russell describes. On this view, what Mary says in uttering (9) in the envisaged context is just (9d).

Soames thinks that the phenomenon of referential usage does not in any way support such a departure from Russell’s theory. He proposes that in uttering (9) Mary asserts (9e):

(9e) [the x: Male(x) & x = Ferdinand] (x is drunk)

This captures an intuitive datum: that, in uttering (9) in the assumed context, Mary says something about Ferdinand. Indeed, she asserts — in virtue of asserting (9e) — that Ferdinand is drunk.

A general strategy for handling cases of referential occurrences of incomplete descriptions can be gleaned from this. (The approach is defended at length in Neale (2004), who also approaches the problem from a Contextualist perspective.) To a first approximation: whenever a speaker utters ‘the F is G’ at a context where ‘the F’ is known to be incomplete and where she intends to say, of a contextually definite F that it is G, what she asserts is: [the x: Fx & x = o] (Gx) (where o is the contextually definite F).

This proposal accounts for the fact that, in uttering (9), Mary appears to assert both the singular proposition that Ferdinand is drunk and the descriptive proposition that a male is drunk. It also avoids the problem noticed by Schiffer — that what Mary says in uttering (9) cannot be identified until we have determined what she implicates — since it is no part of Soames’s proposal that Mary implicates (9d). On the current view she asserts it outright — in virtue of asserting (9e). Nonetheless, it fails to resolve the problem of multiple completions. We are within our rights to ask: what reason do we have to suppose that in uttering (9), Mary said (9e), as opposed to, say, (9f), or any similar completion?

(9f) [the x: Male(x) & x just stepped on my foot & x = Ferdinand] (x is drunk)

This worry carries over to attributive incompleteness — indeed, it remains even if we assume that referential cases are uniformly completed à la (9d). To see the problem, take Soames’s example, (10):

(10) The cook is more experienced than the cook who prepared the main course.

We are to imagine that (10) is uttered over dessert, at a dinner at which no cook has been seen or referred to, but where it is assumed that the cook responsible for the dessert is distinct from the cook responsible for the main course. (10) is unsatisfiable on a flat-footed Russellian construal, so it must have been asserted with the intention of conveying a completion of its standing Russellian content. If so, we are entitled to an answer to the question as to what that content might be. Unfortunately, in most contexts, there will be no uniquely correct answer forthcoming, with the result that the perceived determinacy of such an utterance remains unaccounted for.

Interpreting Legal Texts

One intriguing application of Soames’s Contextualism, in the volume’s final essay, involves the interpretation of legal texts. This discussion will be especially welcome to those philosophers of language who subsist on a steady diet of belief reports and description sentences. Soames here provides a useful distinction between “genuinely hard cases” and “semantically hard cases”. Semantically hard cases are cases where a legal text’s semantic content, together with relevant facts, does not fully determine what we might call its “legal content”, i.e., what the legislature said in drafting, promulgating and/or ratifying the text. In such cases, the text’s semantic content will fail to yield a “(legally correct) outcome”. Genuinely hard cases, in contrast, are cases in which a text’s enriched content — its legal content — fails to yield a correct outcome. Resolving such case will require judicial discretion.

Soames applies this distinction to the case of Smith v. The United States.14 According to the relevant statute:

Whoever, during and in relation to any crime of violence or drug trafficking … uses or carries a firearm, shall, in addition to the punishment provided for such a crime of violence or drug trafficking crime, be sentenced to imprisonment for five years.

In the case in question, John Angus Smith, the defendant, attempted to buy cocaine in exchange for a firearm. The court held that this employment of the firearm came under the statute, which did not discriminate uses; Smith was consequently found guilty.

In the court’s view, the dispute centered on whether an ordinary speaker would construe “uses … a firearm” broadly, so as to apply to guns-for-drugs trade, or narrowly, so as to “explicitly exclude” such uses. While the defense argued that “exchanging a firearm for drugs does not constitute ‘use’ of the firearm within the meaning of the statute,” the court denied this, reasoning that “we normally construe [a statute] in accord with its ordinary or natural meaning” and that “petitioner’s treatment of his [gun] can be described as ‘use’ of the firearm within the every day meaning of that term.”

Justice Scalia dissented, claiming that the “ordinary meaning of ‘uses a firearm’ does not include using it as an article of commerce.” But this is a mistake, Soames argues:

Scalia is wrong in claiming that the ordinary meaning of the phrase excludes uses of firearms for sale or trade. The ordinary meaning is silent about the manner of use (414; emphasis in text).

On Soames’s view, the court is also confused: while the majority was correct to maintain that the semantic content of “uses a firearm” as it occurs in the statute does not “preclude use other than as a weapon” (413), the majority was wrong to draw any conclusions from this fact about the legal (as distinguished from the semantic) content of the statute — crucially, that it pertains to the use of a firearm other than as a weapon.

We thus have a case that is merely semantically hard — one where the semantic content of the statute underdetermines its legal content. While the legislators clearly intended (let us suppose) to impose the additional penalty for drug trafficking involving the use of gun as a firearm, the language that they used — considered in isolation from context — does not carry this enriched content. Now, on the traditional view of the relation between sentence meaning (or semantic content) and assertion, this would settle the matter: the legislature did not say or assert this stronger proposition; what they said was the minimal content of the statute. And since we can identify the legal content of a statute with what it is used to say, this would mean that the stature applied more broadly. But crucially, on Soames’s analysis, what the legislature said (or commanded) was an enrichment of the literal meaning — this enriched meaning being limited to the use of guns as firearms. In consequence, the legal content of the statute is precisely what Scalia claims it is, with the upshot the Smith was wrongly convicted.

2. The Metaphysics of Propositions

Propositions figure prominently in Soames’s writings. He subscribes to a number of familiar theses: propositions function as the referents of ‘that’-clauses; they are what synonymous sentences have in common; they are the objects of speech acts such as assertion, and of psychological states such as belief; they are the bearers of truth values. Another thesis would also seem non-negotiable: propositions have their truth conditions essentially (in contrast to sentences and mental representations, which have their truth conditions contingently). Soames, in a striking departure from orthodoxy, rejects this.

Soames’s concerns can be traced to an observation Russell made in The Principles of Mathematics. There is, Russell noted, a difference between the contribution a verb makes to a proposition and the contribution a “verbal noun” would make were it to replace the verb — between what is said by ‘A differs from B’ and what, if anything, is conveyed by ‘A difference B.’ (As Russell put it, there is a difference between “a relation in itself and a relation actually relating” (§54).) But on the structured-propositions analysis of the former we get merely <<a, b>, difference>, which seems to involve the relation in itself, and not the relation actually relating — precisely what we associate with the latter.

Soames reasons similarly. He has us consider the meaning assigned to (11). On Soames’s view, this would be the abstract structure, (11a).

(11) A is larger than B.

(11a) <<a, b>, larger-than>

On the standard account, (11a) is true just in case <a, b> is in the extension of the larger-than relation. But this specific reading is not forced on us by anything in (11a) itself. As Soames makes clear, for all its structure, there are several ways in which (11a) can represent the world as being — if, indeed, it represents the world in any way at all: as being such that a is larger than b, as being such that b is larger than a, as being such that a is larger than a, etc. But if there is nothing about (11a) that corresponds to a particular way that the world might be, then (11a) cannot be intrinsically representational.

One might be tempted to bite the bullet here, and respond that propositions are "inherently and intrinsically representational, and so sui generis" — which would mean that they are inherently and intrinsically unified, as well:15

However, this is a council of despair. Davidson wouldn’t accept such obscurantism, and we shouldn’t either. If we posit structured propositions as meanings of sentences, we ought to explain what they are, and how they are able to play the roles we assign to them (244; note omitted).

This leads Soames to the dramatic conclusion “that propositions aren’t intrinsically representational.”

How, then, do propositions represent? Soames holds that the proposition expressed by (11) is a complex, involving a, b and the larger-than relation, standing in a given relation R, not itself contained in the proposition. So, more precisely: "How does it come about that this entity … represents a as being larger than b?" The answer has to do with "the interpretation placed on R by the way that we use it" (244; emphasis in text). This idea is illuminated by an analogy.

On my map, the dot labeled ‘Los Angeles’ [d1] is (roughly) two inches below and half an inch to the right of the dot labeled ‘San Francisco’ [d2]. The standing of these dots in this spatial relation on the map represents the city Los Angeles as being (roughly) 320 miles south and 80 miles east of the city San Francisco. It does so, in part, because of the interpretation we give to the relation being two inches below and half an inch to the right of on the map (245; emphasis in text).

So, the standing of a, b and larger-than in the R relation is analogous to d1 and d2 standing in the relation of being two inches below and half an inch to the right of (henceforth, R*).16 Now, in the case of Soames’s map, it is clear that giving a specific interpretation to R* is what relates the two points in such a way that they represent Los Angeles as being approximately 320 miles south and 80 miles east of San Francisco. Soames’s suggestion is that giving a specific interpretation to R will similarly relate the respective constituents of the proposition expressed by (11) — a, b and larger-than — so that the proposition (relative to the interpretation) represents a as being larger than b.

A map will represent Los Angeles as being a certain distance from San Francisco due to an interpretation we impose on the spatial configuration involving d1 and d2. What is it for an ordered sequence, such as that displayed in (11a), to represent? Soames’s answer is that for (11a) to count "as the proposition that a is larger than b … is for us to use the structure to predicate larger than of a and b." And for us to use the structure (11a) in the relevant way is

for us to use the grammatical structure of some sentence or other representation, the semantic contents of the constituents of which are a, b, and larger-than, to predicate the latter of the former. In these cases, the representational properties of propositions are grounded in, and explained by, the representational properties of sentences, not the other way around (245-6; emphasis in text).

For Soames, the claim that the abstract structure (11a) isn’t intrinsically representational is a direct consequence of its not being intrinsically unified. It is only when (11a) is unified that it has the capacity to represent. Interpreting the structure — selecting one among several ways in which the elements can be arranged — unifies it, adding the fact that the elements of a representation stand in a given relation to one another.

This further fact introduces a difficulty. Recall that a relation such as larger-than as it occurs in (11a) doesn’t itself relate a and b. One is thus left to wonder how it is that the relation R manages to relate the elements a, b and larger-than in the appropriate manner, so as to produce a unified representation — something that possesses a truth-condition. The suggestion that certain things are intrinsically representational is problematic, and Soames is right to question it. But the suggestion that certain relations are intrinsically relating, so to speak, is hardly less so.

There is also a threat of circularity. For (11a) to represent is for a speaker to use (11) to predicate larger than of <a, b>. But this requires a clear answer to the question: Which uses of (11) constitute genuine predications? An obvious response — ‘those uses which count as assertions’ — would seem unavailable, since assertion is most naturally construed as a propositional attitude. Until an alternative, non-propositional account of assertion is provided, it’s not obvious that the account really dispenses with propositions after all.

Even if Soames provides us with a non-circular analysis of assertion, it is still unclear what foundational role propositions play here. After all, on the current account, the fundamental bearers of truth and falsity are sentences — or, more precisely, uses of sentences to predicate properties (or relations) of individuals (or sequences). Soames offers that propositions still have a role to play as the meanings of sentences, the common property of synonymous sentences, the objects of propositional attitudes, etc. But the idea is underdeveloped, and is vulnerable to an obvious rejoinder. Why is it necessary to speak of the proposition expressed by (11) when we can speak of the use of (11) to predicate the value of ‘larger than’ to the ordered values of ‘A’ and ‘B’? Proposition-talk may be a convenient shorthand for describing the contents of assertions, but I fail to see how Soames has shown them to be indispensible.17

3. Conclusion

I have attempted to show the richness of Soames’s discussions, and to convey some of the characteristic features of his approach. In doing so, I have perforce ignored certain topics treated at length in the volume and of equal importance to the ones discussed here, including an important discussion, in Essay Eleven, on the role of Gricean conversational maxims in determining what is said (as opposed to what is merely implicated), further developing Soames’s account of pragmatic enrichment. Serious students of philosophy of language will want to master these essays, both for their intrinsic interest and for the clarity of thought they exemplify.18


Buchanan, R. (2010) “A Puzzle about Meaning and Communication”. Noûs 44: 340-71.

Neale, S. (2004) “This, That, and the Other”. In Anne Bezuidenhout and Marga Reimer (eds.), Descriptions and Beyond. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Neale, S. (2007) “On Location”. In M. O’Rourke and C. Washington (eds.), Situating Semantics: Essays in Honor of John Perry. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Recanati, F. (1993) Direct Reference: From Language to Thought. Oxford: Blackwell.

Russell, B. (1903) The Principles of Mathematics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Schiffer, S. (2005) “Russell’s Theory of Definite Descriptions”. Mind 114: 1135-83.

Soames, S. (2002) Beyond Rigidity. New York: Oxford University Press.

Soames, S. (2006) “Reply to Critics”. Philosophical Studies 128: 711-38.

Soames, S. (2009) Philosophical Essays Volume 2: The Philosophical Significance of Language. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Soames, S. (2010) What is Meaning? Princeton: Princeton University Press.

1 Soames (2009) (reviewed in NDPR by Cara Spencer).

2 Following Soames, I’ll use these terms interchangeably.

3 Here and in what follows ‘utters’ should be understood as assertively utters. Reference to context will be suppressed in the interest of readability.

4 Which is not to deny that there are constraints on enrichment — only to note that these constraints do not emanate from S‘s grammatical structure.

5 The propositional contribution of “is not” is the property NEG, which applies to propositions in the same way that “has the capacity to fly” applies to individuals. The proposition corresponding to "it is not the case that p" (and variants thereof) has the form: <p, NEG>, where NEG applies to a proposition p just in case p is false.

6 One might worry that this fails to apply to closely related cases, such as (i).

(i) Lois doesn’t know that Clark is Superman.

It would be absurd for Mary to assert that Lois doesn’t know the necessary truth, (ii); it seems more plausible to take her as having asserted that Lois doesn’t know the truth of the enrichment, (iii):

(ii) <<Superman, Superman>, Identity><superman,><superman,>


(iii) <<<Superman, <superman,></superman,><superman,><superman,>superhero>, <Superman</superman,><superman,><superman,><superman,>, reporter>>, Identity>


But now we appear to have a problem. If Mary asserts that Lois doesn’t know (iii) she must thereby also assert that Lois doesn’t know (ii), since (ii) is a necessary and a priori consequence of (iii). In fact, attitude reports involving verbs like ’doesn’t know’, ‘doubts’, ‘discovers’, etc. are not closed under logical consequence. For example, if Lois doesn’t know that p & q