Philosophical Foundations of European Union Law

Placeholder book cover

Julie Dickson and Pavlos Eleftheriadis (eds.), Philosophical Foundations of European Union Law, Oxford University Press, 2012, 457pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199588770.

Reviewed by Jonathan White, London School of Economics and Political Science


Philosophical foundations of EU law: while the title suggests a study of mostly regional significance, this rich collection of essays offers a powerful reflection on contemporary law more broadly.[1] Europe stands in for some wider trends: the multiplication of international organisations and treaties, the decoupling of law from the state, the rise of overlapping jurisdictions, and the attempt to ground law in a bedrock of universal values, as well as disquiet amongst some about the moral and political meaning of such trends. Across sixteen substantial chapters by leading scholars, the contours of a coherent and lively discussion emerge. If the political and economic events of the last few years raise some important issues only lightly touched on here, their analysis should be thought of as a continuation of the project this book has advanced.

That project has broadly two strands. As a contribution to the analysis of legal practice, it seeks to determine the degree of coherence present in the transnational legal forms that have emerged in Europe over the last half-century, and to understand the mechanisms which foster or detract from this coherence. As a contribution to legal and political philosophy, it examines how the EU directs us to revisit some of the classic puzzles of legal thought, not so as to declare them obsolete but so as to approach them in a new light. As the editors Julie Dickson and Pavlos Eleftheriadis underscore in their introduction, the transnational is to be treated as a distinct legal domain. While the conventional categories of legal analysis can advance the inquiry, we are dealing with something rather more than a pale version of the modern state.

The collection begins by taking the measure of law's complexity as it moves beyond the state setting. One of the challenges is to identify what, exactly, has been transnationalised. Dickson's opening chapter poses a basic conceptual question: can the concept of a legal system travel to a transnational order such as the EU? Despite instinct telling us that systematic unity may be an early casualty of law's rescaling, her view is broadly affirmative. We can speak, and ought to speak, the language of legal systems. The argument has an interpretive character. For those living under the law, it is always important that law present itself as their law, not as a foreign intrusion. These valued feelings of ownership and attachment are what the concept of legal system responds to; they can hardly be experienced without it. Legal thought should hesitate to ignore a concept which is 'part of the conceptual currency used by individuals living under law to understand themselves and their social and political world' (p. 31). Moreover, suggests Dickson, if we listen to the claims of judicial actors themselves, we see that the concept of legal system is central to their self-understandings. For several decades, the European Court of Justice (ECJ) has been using the concept to refer to EU law, not least as a means to mark out its jurisdiction. Others have evoked the legal systems of the EU's member-states precisely to contest this jurisdiction. In Pierre Bourdieu's terms (not Dickson's), 'legal system' is a category of practice, and for this reason merits consideration as a category of analysis.[2]

The question then becomes how to recognise legal systems when one sees them -- their institutions, their boundaries, the character of their relations. Are they, for instance, constituted by the existence of independent law-creating institutions such as parliaments? Or are they -- her preferred view, following Raz and others -- constituted by the existence of law-applying institutions such as courts? What exactly does the EU consist of: one encompassing the EU legal system, or 28 systems (those of its member states), or perhaps 28 systems plus one?[3]

As Dickson sets it up, much turns on how Europe's courts, both at the EU and national level, understand their activities and the claims they make for them. We should favour a '28 + 1' model, she suggests, because this best does justice to the understandings of the actors involved.[4] Any other perspective does violence to the claims of national courts or the ECJ. As the author is aware, there are problems with such an approach: it risks an unquestioning attitude towards the claims judicial actors make, taking them at face value and conflating categories of practice and analysis. The judges of the ECJ for instance are hardly disinterested: could their claims be overstated? Indeed, might there be divergent opinions within the ECJ on such questions?[5] Is it not the role of the philosopher to offer criteria by which to distinguish the justifiable claims from the wild?

In their chapter 'Not a system but an order', Keith Culver and Michael Giudice take a step back from what judicial figures have to say. The claims of such actors conflict: perhaps less so than is commonly believed, but enough to suggest not all can be assumed true. Like Dickson, but by different means, the authors arrive at a pluralist conception of Europe's legal arrangements, stressing the respectful interaction of actors responsive to diverse sources of authority. Though more complex in institutional terms than the concept of 'system' can accommodate, the whole still amounts to an 'order'. The authors sketch out an account of non-hierarchical inter-institutional coordination to explain how this order is achieved. Given the upheaval of recent years, some may find the concept of order as euphemistic as the concept of system. Even if spontaneous order has indeed been the EU's normal condition, probably we should not be too quick to read this as indicative of EU law's solid 'foundations' (p. 68), whether to be explained by norms of inter-institutional accommodation or any other would-be structuring mechanism. But the authors are far from alone in embracing a form of constitutional pluralism that seeks to describe constructive relations between the parts rather than the radical pluralism of competing orders.[6]

Whether Europe displays one legal order or several is a persistent theme of the book. In various guises, questions of monism and pluralism recur. In part this reflects the EU's ambiguity as an empirical object -- its founding treaties, its present status, and of course its direction of travel. In part it is the effect of some underlying normative debates about the merits of different constitutional structures (more on these below). But at the deepest level it reflects differing conceptions of the nature of law itself. Should it be conceived in a broadly positivist sense as a system of rules, with an attending concern for non-contradiction, sovereignty and clear chains of authority? Or should it be understood in more Platonic terms, as an underlying body of normativity irreducible to the institutions and decisions that might approximate it?

George Letsas urges us to take the latter view, and suggests that doing so allows us to dissolve some of the problems to do with coherence and supremacy that seem to bedevil jurisprudence (if not legal practice) as it is developed in non-state contexts. His is an explicitly monistic view: legal pluralism -- the coexistence of multiple legal systems within the same political community -- is chimerical. Not unlike Culver and Giudice, he observes that EU law is generally far more ordered (or 'harmonious') than its complexity might suggest. He rejects however that this is the result of some process of inter-institutional dialogue that successfully manages legal pluralism (an argument further developed by Anthony Arnull in the same volume). Rather, it is that in the last instance, once one strips away the contingencies of how law comes to be codified in particular settings, a unitary legal-moral order reveals itself (p. 96). Not for Letsas the temptation to genuflect before the claims of legal actors: 'law's demands are mind-independent', he writes, and 'the mere social fact that some institution (be it a court or legislature) made a decision is not sufficient for the existence of a legal right or duty' (p.97). Rival claims to supremacy make no real sense, for questions of decision-making competence are 'objectively determined by moral facts' (p.100), and it falls to courts simply to display coordination in their efforts to channel this underlying morality.

Here then is one attempt to dispel concern about conflicts of law once one moves from the national to the transnational setting, and to find coherence without relying on the institutional concept of system. Of course, Letsas' monism is grounded in moral objectivism. Judicial decisions are a matter of right and wrong. Those who wonder whether moral truths are so certain, or whether all can agree to them even if they are certain, will find such an approach unsatisfactory. Even those firmly committed to ideas of universal morality may wonder whether this kind of moralisation of the law, if widely accepted, would not have unwelcome political effects, e.g. in the form of the moralisation of public debate and the shrinking of the space of legitimate disagreement. When law, at its best, is simply true, the dissident, at her best, is no better than mad or bad. Such a worldview makes disharmony -- in party politics, in inter-state negotiations -- inevitably seem like an aberration. For the moral objectivist, this may be one more chimerical problem, but if it leads to civic disengagement and disaffection with political institutions it could prove the undoing of EU law.

Scepticism towards a moralistic conception of the law would seem to point one back towards legal positivism, one of the classic justifications for which was always the challenge of moral pluralism. In the transnational context, positivism might seem to go hand in hand with legal pluralism (perhaps along the lines of 28 + 1), given the lack of an uncontested hierarchy of authority. For Lorenzo Zucca, however, only a monistic positivism can suffice. Whatever its merits as a descriptive theory, pluralism can hardly be an acceptable normative standpoint: incoherent practices are not to be put in a good light. Europe's courts do tend to defer to one another, he notes, producing the outward signs of order and harmony that others observe, but this is not to be read as a sign that pluralism 'works', any more than it indicates the kind of value monism Letsas describes. Rather, it is an unstable and undesirable modus vivendi -- courts avoid conflict because it could weaken their relative power, and appeal to notions of fundamental rights as cover. Authentic disagreements on the nature of such rights, e.g., those having to do with the competing principles of social welfare and market efficiency, end up being hidden rather than addressed (pp. 337-8).[7] While genuine legal monism on a European scale seems far off, Zucca sees early signs of it in the accession of the EU to the ECHR and in the making of the Charter of Fundamental Rights. He concludes: 'it is only when there is a coherent set of institutions formally organised according to hierarchical principles and clear rules that we can improve on the protection of fundamental rights' (p. 353).

A constructed system of rules and the imperatives of abstract reason are clearly two very different conceptions of the philosophical foundations of law beyond the state. It is not quite procedure against substance, but the gap is large: are middle ways possible? W. J. Waluchow suggests we should take seriously the claims to moral unity expressed in such texts as the EU's Charter of Fundamental Rights -- more so than some pluralists and positivists might wish -- without appealing directly to a Platonic, objective morality. The norms evoked in the Charter are the historically-formed convictions of a particular community, adjusted in line with universalist concerns -- Sittlichkeit refined in the pursuit of Moralität. They express values genuinely held in common, but coexist alongside deep and persistent moral disagreement, as well as differences in how common values are locally institutionalised. While this universalist/particularist amalgam is a familiar trope in contemporary theorising about how a European ethos might relate to the normative orders of nation-states -- advanced by Habermas, amongst others -- Waluchow offers suggestive insights into what it might entail for judicial practice. The role of judges, he suggests, should be seen as

not to adjudicate on the basis of their own convictions regarding the truths of Platonic political morality, but to hold the EU community to its own fundamental commitments . . . The judge is, in effect, helping to implement, and render effective, the democratic will within the EU -- helping the relevant community . . . to live up to the moral commitments it made when its officials formally and fully signed up to the Charter upon entering into the Treaty of Lisbon. (pp. 204-5)

By casting the judge as an interpreter of commitments made rather than the conduit of moral truth, Waluchow seeks to avoid a conception of transnational law that places it directly in tension with political ideas of collective self-determination.

It may be, of course, that even this apparently factual task requires considerably more creativity than some would wish. Interpreting the requirements of international treaties -- central to the activity of judges in a transnational legal setting -- is no easy task, given that a certain ambiguity in their provisions may have been the condition of their being agreed in the first place. Takis Tridimas, in an instructive discussion of the role of precedent in EU law, suggests national courts and the ECJ do have shared reference-points to which to tether their interpretations, not least the past decisions of the ECJ. Especially 'Where the [European] Court [of Justice] breaks new ground, reverses precedent, or rules on an important provision which is general in scope, its guidelines acquire almost a quasi-legislative character' (p. 327). This would go some way to assuaging concerns about judicial activism, at least at the national level. It may be though that he understates the contestedness of ECJ decisions, certainly if we accept the arguments of recent historical research on the ECJ.[8] The judges of the EU legal order -- national and European -- do considerably more than passively interpret moral principles and the agreements reached by elected representatives. To this extent, Waluchow's aim to circumscribe their role in the name of collective self-determination looks hopeful, even if well-motivated.

Law's relation to democracy emerges as a central problem in these debates. One of the reasons we might reach for the concept of legal system is, after all, the suspicion it may be a necessary corollary of popular sovereignty.[9] While this might suggest a form of monism is indispensible if the European Union is to be a democratic order -- no unified order, no European demos -- Mattias Kumm wants us to see the enlightened democrat as a constitutional pluralist. Transnational democracy being widely considered a remote prospect, he sees the democrat as someone likely to regard his commitments as best respected in the transnational context by rejecting the monistic aspirations of EU law in favour of the plural orders of Europe's democratic states. Democracy produces negative externalities however: a pure 'democratic statism' is nothing to endorse. Hence, on an enlightened view, the interests of the wider, transnational community should generally have priority, but tempered by the demands of national democracy where these protect the constitutional principles of the national legal order. Kumm renders this perspective with the term 'cosmopolitan constitutionalism', and sees it as one that draws out the coherence of existing EU judicial practices. The two competing principles of legality and democracy are thus reconciled -- heavily in favour of the former, it should be said.[10] Surprisingly perhaps, given the overt celebration of pluralism, it bears emphasising that monism is close at hand: it is only because the transnational public good is considered relatively self-evident that the whims of national democracy can be contained within a transnationalism not itself based in democracy. One may have reservations about this strategy. Why democracy should be endorsed at any level, other than as a prudent concession to the sensibility of modern citizens, may become unclear as one goes down this route. If we take value differences seriously, or even if we simply want to persuade people of the commitments worth having, there would seem to be no substitute for debating alternatives in some kind of public forum and shaping decision-making accordingly, at the transnational level as at any other. Absent this possibility, it is not clear we should be seeking to find meaning and coherence in the status quo.

A more critical take on EU law is found in those chapters approaching it less formally and more historically. J.H.H. Weiler examines what he calls the EU's distinctive 'political and legal culture' (p. 140), rooted in the particularities of how it was conceived and structured from the beginning, and asks what the consequences have been of European integration's 'pronounced reliance on the law and legal institutions' (p. 150). The answer is sobering. Whatever the theoretical merits of EU law -- he is, of course, a friendly critic -- it has come to be received by the peoples of Europe as a source of disempowerment, due to its long-term estrangement from democratic practices. The ECJ is a culprit here, having championed, as was its remit, individual rights over collective self-determination. Weiler evokes a much stronger tension than Kumm between the principles of legality and democracy, at least as they have been instantiated in post-war Europe. Unable to marry these two bases of political legitimacy, and seeking ways to repair the alienating effects of juridification, the EU has resorted to charismatic narratives by which to present itself as the guarantor of ideals -- 'political messianism', as he terms it. Myth rather than morality emerges as the precarious foundation of EU law.

Likewise in historical mode, others ask what purposes law has been put to over the course of European integration. What ends has it been used to pursue? The centrality of market-making can hardly be overlooked, and leads Sionaidh Douglas-Scott to raise some classical questions to do with law's relationship with capitalism.[11] Since Weber we have been accustomed to see an elective affinity between the two, an affinity the history of EU law-making would seem to confirm transnationally. While some might see this as an observation of mainly sociological significance, an attempt to explore the philosophical foundations of EU law can hardly ignore the attendant issues to do with the extent of law's possible neutrality, its tendency to further certain interests, and the extent to which EU law can be freed of free-market principles. In the pluralism versus monism debates extensively covered in this volume, here would seem to be an underexplored angle. Is a certain conception of the EU legal order more conducive than others to a market economy? What, if any, are the constitutional preconditions of social welfare?

As Douglas-Scott notes, if we are to approach EU law in its socio-political context, it may be that our understanding of its affinities needs to be updated. As Franz Neumann once argued, and others have since, the preference of large-scale capitalists for a robust legal framework is decreasingly evident. While clear and stable rules may have suited capital in an earlier era, reducing uncertainty and improving calculability, in an age of increasingly instantaneous transactions these legal supports may be widely deemed superfluous, even an unwelcome constraint.[12] We might then ask, not whether capitalism and the law are mutually dependent, but whether in the contemporary transnational setting they are not actually in sharp tension. Capitalism may be law's antagonist.

This thought raises some interesting larger questions about the status of law in today's EU. To what extent can we speak genuinely of the rule of law at the transnational level? Does the law shape and constrain, or is it merely an outward form, an instrument of choice that masks action of a discretionary kind? Does the law bind some more than others? Two chapters towards the end of the book take on these basic themes. For Geert de Baere, the core meaning of the rule of law is that 'no authority should remain unchecked by law' (p. 368). His message is largely a reassuring one: 'the rule of law is the cornerstone of European integration' (p. 381). The 'ordinary Union method' of decision-making, used to build the common market, displays the typical rule-of-law virtues: checks and balances, a fairly clear division of competences, and the protection of individual rights. The exception to the rule has been European foreign and security policy, an area where judicial checks are weak, just as they tend to be at the national level. Executive powers claim that to bind their actions in advance would be to weaken their stance on the international stage, where not all actors are similarly constrained, and thus where unpredictability reigns. De Baere argues that developing a legal framework in this area will therefore be a challenge entwined with the global pursuit of international law.

Of course, in a certain sense European integration as a whole bears the traces of a foreign-policy initiative. For a number of interested parties throughout the history of the process, the desire to escape checks and balances at the national level has arguably been one of the sources of its appeal. Douglas-Scott sees the EU as highly imperfect in rule-of-law terms, and not just in a particular policy domain. Business-friendly 'flexibility', coupled with the tendentious application of 'the rule of law as rule of free trade' (p. 444), has subverted it even in the core realm of the economy. Europe has played out, in other words, the late-modern tension between capitalism and the rule of law. But she cautions against sacrificing the rule of law as an ideal. A just political order can be pursued no other way: indeed, she argues, the rule of law is a constitutive feature of justice. Even if we stop short of a moralised conception of the law, where the rule of law essentially means the rule of good law, we should appreciate that the values it delivers go beyond the merely procedural ones of predictability and non-arbitrariness to include accountability, equality and freedom (pp. 434ff.). The pursuit of these latter -- always in jeopardy under contemporary capitalism -- must involve enlisting law's support. Whether a pluralistic vision of law can guide such a project, or whether legal monism and the rule of law go together, are questions she ultimately leaves open.

These issues demand particular scrutiny in the light of the ongoing Euro-crisis. For much of this book -- Douglas-Scott is an exception -- one gets little sense of the EU's current malaise and of the ambiguous place of legality therein.[13] How central has law been in Europe's response to economic crisis. On the one hand, it has been omnipresent: wide areas of decision-making which used to be the stuff of representative politics -- budgetary policy in particular -- have been brought into the sphere of binding international agreements and look set to be enforced judicially. The juridification of the political apparently continues. But on the other hand, it is not EU law but public international law that has been the basis of many such measures. Faced with the protracted processes of EU law-making (De Baere's 'ordinary Union method'), Europe's executive powers have tended to prefer ad hoc arrangements -- legal in form, yet in no sense part of a comprehensive legal framework. An abundance of legal options has had the effect of reinforcing executive discretion. What the crisis suggests is that the limited reach of EU law is at least as important as any conflicts internal to it. Events illustrate just how far Europe is from displaying the rule of law at a transnational level, as well as how disconnected the law is from processes of democratic authorship and deliberation. Edicts for the masses, discretion for the few -- one does not have to be a populist to sense some truth in this description.

Should philosophers of EU law be troubled? For some legal theorists -- a minority, no doubt -- these developments are simply to be applauded. Executive power has revealed itself unshackled: a stronger and more dynamic Union beckons. This is not a view present in the volume under review, and it is inconsistent with most of what is, but it may be worth noting given such arguments are advanced in debates over the rule of law in North America.[14] An alternative response, probably of wider appeal, would hold that the problems are genuine but the present moment is exceptional. Legality has been (partially) interrupted, but for the sake of forging a new order in which legality is likely to be fortified: the problem is essentially a transition one. It is too early to assess this view fully, but there are reasons to think executive discretion will continue to be a dominant feature of European governance. The EU has no monopoly on the making of international treaties, and governments thwarted by its institutions will continue to have reason to seek 'coalitions of the willing' outside its structures. The price of keeping them inside may be agreements whose provisions are deliberately vague, and thus placing little constraint on executive action. In the judicial field, those tasked with interpreting EU law will then find themselves faced with significant choices to make: which rules to enforce, which political goals to prioritise. Judicial and executive discretion combine.

Still, it may still be wondered whether the Euro-crisis is not simply beside the point. As we have seen, the concept of law includes both empirical and normative elements -- rules as they have been codified, and principles as they should be. For those who gravitate towards an emphasis on the latter, the empirical difficulties of the EU may be marginal to a jurisprudence of EU law. They may reflect badly on certain political actors, perhaps even on a passive judiciary, but they do not reflect badly on the law as such. They exist on a different plane. This is a coherent view, and one not without critical potential, but it directs us to individual failings rather than institutional ones. The risk is that it leaves us silent on some important questions to do with what can plausibly be expected of transnational law and what must be sought by other means. It is moreover the imperfections of EU law as it is institutionalised that may determine whether it survives and in what form.

'The role of a philosophy of European law,' suggests Zucca, 'is to help to understand what exists and whether it makes sense' (p. 352). This seems a valid interpretation. Perhaps, in light of what is going on in Europe today, some of the contributors to this volume are a little too willing to find sense in things as they stand, sometimes to dignify them with an attractive label. In the age of austerity, it is unclear whether virtuous-sounding practices such as 'judicial dialogue' are sufficiently hard-nosed to provide resources for countering the wayward exercise of executive power.[15] This volume provides an excellent survey of the idea of transnational law, and deserves to be studied closely. Future scholarship will need to ask whether EU law's philosophical foundations are strong enough to take the strain from its flagging social, economic and political foundations.

[1] For comments on a draft I am very grateful to Mike Wilkinson and Lea Ypi.

[2] Bourdieu, Pierre (1991), Language and Symbolic Power (Cambridge: Polity).

[3] I add one to her numbers to reflect the accession of Croatia to the EU in July 2013.

[4] Both the national and EU legal orders continue to 'claim authority to determine the existence, force, and effect of their norms, and to determine for themselves the relation between their own norms and the norms of other normative systems with which they come into contact. The fact that such claims are consistently made by national legal orders is one piece of evidence supporting the view that they remain distinct legal systems' (p.49).

[5] Cf. Bill Davies and Morten Rasmussen (forthcoming), 'From International Law to a European Rechtsgemeinschaft: Towards a New History of European Law, 1950-1979', Publications of the European Union Liaison Committee of Historians (Baden-Baden: Nomos).

[6] As Kumm later puts it (p. 217), a 'radical pluralism . . . where actors of each legal order proceed without systemic regard for the coherence of the whole'.

[7] Zucca's position is best characterised as agonistic towards moral objectivism rather than sceptical (cf. p. 344).

[8] Davies and Rasmussen, 'From International Law to a European Rechtsgemeinschaft'.

[9] Cf. Dickson's emphasis on legal systems as 'claims to self-determination' (p. 49).

[10] Also in this volume, under the heading of 'demoicracy', Kalypso Nicolaïdis outlines a project with certain common features  --  notably, a commitment to reconciling state-level democracy with a transnational public good, without advocating the reconstitution of democracy at a transnational level.

[11] Zucca (p. 335) raises some of the same questions in passing.

[12] Cf. Scheuerman, William (2004), Liberal Democracy and the Social Acceleration of Time (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins), p. 161: 'there is a least one reason for this unexpected challenge to the traditional view of an elective affinity between capitalism and the rule of law: social acceleration tends to minimise the dependence of certain entrepreneurs on classical liberal law. Particularly within financial and capital markets, simultaneity and instantaneousness reduce the economic agent's reliance on the rule of law as an instrument for counteracting uncertainty stemming from the duration and distance of commercial life, and thus it is no surprise that legal trends there conflict with the traditional liberal model.'

[13] Recent constitutional developments in Hungary and Romania also deserve attention, given the questions they raise concerning the enforcement of norms and whether an EU member-state can legitimately be expelled. See Müller, Jan-Werner (2013), 'Defending Democracy within the EU', Journal of Democracy 24 (2).

[14] Posner, Eric A. and Adrian Vermeule (2011), The Executive Unbound: After the Madisonian Republic (Oxford: OUP).

[15] For a useful critical overview of the legal implications of the Euro-crisis, see the special issue in German Law Journal 14 (5), 2013.