Philosophical Foundations of Neuroscience

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Bennett, M.R. and Hacker, P.M.S., Philosophical Foundations of Neuroscience, 2003, Blackwell Publishing, 480pp, $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 140510838X.

Reviewed by Dennis Patterson, Rutgers University, Camden and New Brunswick


Neuroscience is the study of the physiological mechanisms that give rise to a manifold of human capacities, including perception, memory, vision and the emotions. To achieve the goals of scientific understanding, neuroscientists must of necessity advance claims and hypotheses which are subjected to scientific experiment. In addition to experimental techniques, neuroscientists need a conceptual framework within which to make sense of the results of their empirical work. In short, a necessary complement to empirical research is a coherent conception of the phenomena under investigation, that is, human psychological capacities.

Bennett - a distinguished neuroscientist - and Hacker - the preeminent scholar of Wittgenstein's thought - have teamed up to produce a withering attack on the conception of the mental that lies at the heart of contemporary neuroscience. Although neuroscientists are committed materialists, and adamantly insist on this aspect of their anti-Cartesianism, they have, Bennett and Hacker argue, merely jettisoned the dual substance doctrine of Cartesianism, but retained its faulty structure with respect to the relation of mind and behavior.

The book is divided into four parts followed by two appendices. Part I (“Philosophical Problems in Neuroscience: Their Historical and Conceptual Roots”) is, among other things, a survey of the historical and conceptual roots of the biological basis for sensory, volitional and intellectual capacities. Aristotle's work on the psuchê established the paradigm for sophisticated speculation on the relationship of the mental to the physical. The psuchê - the idea that every living organism has a “form” – characterized the soul not as an entity separate from the body but more akin to an array of powers or capacities exhibited by living things. In time, Aristotle's early biological conjectures were modified by subsequent scientific research (e.g. Galen on nerves and brain) but his philosophical views continued as the basis for theoretical discussion until the arrival of Descartes.

What interests Bennett and Hacker about the Cartesian replacement of Aristotelian thought is the extent to which contemporary neuroscientists have failed to go far enough in their rejection of Cartesianism, thereby threatening the integrity of their scientific endeavors. In brief, these are the key elements of Descartes's legacy:

(1) Descartes reconceived the soul “not as the principle of life, but as the principle of thought or consciousness” (p. 26), a thesis which led to the idea that the mind was separate from the body in all respects. This formulation inevitably “casts a long shadow over neuroscientific reflection … .(p. 26);
(2) Descartes further complicated his position by insisting that while distinct, mind and body are united. The central problematic to emerge for both Cartesianism and its inheritors is how to explain the connection between mind and body;
(3) The only thesis of Descartes that withstood critical objection was his claim that “explanation at the neurophysiological level will be in terms of efficient causation” (p.27). In this respect, Bennett and Hacker remind us that “Descartes contributed substantially to advances in neurophysiology and visual theory” (p.27).

Once the Cartesian paradigm took hold, it fell to neuroscientists to work out its implications at the experimental level. For two generations (from Sherrington to his protégés) modern brain scientists remained fundamentally Cartesian (i.e. they adhered to the Cartesian explanatory framework of the relation of mind to body). The third and current generation of neuroscientists repudiated Cartesian dualism, replacing the mind with the brain as the explanatory locus of human psychological and emotional capacities. But, Bennett and Hacker argue, merely replacing the mind with the brain falls short of a repudiation of the structure of the Cartesian explanatory system.

In Chapter 3 of Part I - “The Mereological Fallacy in Neuroscience” - Bennett and Hacker set out a critical framework that is the pivot of the book. They argue that for some neuroscientists, the brain does all manner of things: it believes (Crick); interprets (Edelman); knows (Blakemore); poses questions to itself (Young); makes decisions (Damasio); contains symbols (Gregory) and represents information (Marr). Implicit in these assertions is a philosophical mistake, insofar as it unreasonably inflates the conception of the 'brain' by assigning to it powers and activities that are normally reserved for sentient beings. It is the degree to which these assertions depart from the norms of linguistic practice that sends up a red flag. The reason for objection is this: it is one thing to suggest on empirical grounds correlations between a subjective, complex whole (say, the activity of deciding and some particular physical part of that capacity, say, neural firings) but there is considerable objection to concluding that the part just is the whole. These claims are not false; rather, they are devoid of sense.

Wittgenstein remarked that it is only of a human being that it makes sense to say “it has sensations; it sees, is blind; hears, is deaf; is conscious or unconscious.” (Philosophical Investigations, § 281). The question whether brains think “is a philosophical question, not a scientific one” (p. 71). To attribute such capacities to brains is to commit what Bennett and Hacker identify as “the mereological fallacy”, that is, the fallacy of attributing to parts of an animal attributes that are properties of the whole being. Moreover, merely replacing the mind by the brain leaves intact the misguided Cartesian conception of the relationship between the mind and behavior, merely replacing the ethereal by grey glutinous matter. The structure of the Cartesian explanatory system remains intact, and this leads to Bennett and Hacker's conclusion that contemporary cognitive neuroscientists are not nearly anti-Cartesian enough. Much more of the Cartesian conceptual scheme needs to be rejected.

But how serious is the mereological fallacy? Why can we not regard talk of the brain “believing” or “interpreting” as a mere façon de parler or harmless metaphorical talk? It is not difficult to take Bennett and Hacker's objections seriously when one reads neuroscientists (e.g., Semir Zeki) arguing that knowledge acquisition is a “primordial function of the brain” such that it falls to neuroscience “to solve the problems of epistemology … .” (p. 75). Similarly, J.Z. Young speaks of knowledge and information encoded in the brain “just as knowledge can be recorded in books or computers” (J.Z. Young, Programs of the Brain (OUP, 1978), p. 192). Finally, Milner, Squire and Kandel all speak of “declarative memory” which, they maintain, is “stored in the brain” (Brenda Milner, Larry R. Squire and Eric R. Kandel, “Cognitive neuroscience and the study of memory,” Neuron, 20 (1998), p. 450). Neuroscientific research that proceeds from conceptually flawed premises is likely to yield incoherent empirical questions and answers that escape illumination of any kind. In this regard Bennett and Hacker make the case that, done well, philosophy matters deeply for the proper conduct of neuroscience.

The mereological fallacy is but one dimension of the shadow cast by Cartesianism over the landscape of contemporary neuroscience. In Part II (“Human Faculties and Contemporary Neuroscience”) the authors detail the reach of Cartesianism and empiricism in the areas of sensation and perception, the cognitive powers, the cogitative powers, emotions, volition and voluntary movement. Just as Locke argued that perception is explained as the causation of ideas in the mind, some contemporary neuroscientists explain perception as the result of visual or auditory images in the brain. These neuroscientists work to discover the neural substratum in the brain that enables persons to exercise powers of sight, emotion and volition. Bennett and Hacker advance no objection to these scientific undertakings. The object of their critique is the explanatory framework within which these theorists extrapolate from scientific results to theories of the mental.

Philosophers of mind are themselves prone to similar conceptual errors. Consider John Searle on pain and the role of the brain:

Common sense tells us that our pains are located in physical space within our bodies, that for example, a pain in the foot is literally inside the area of the foot. But we now know that is false. The brain forms a body image and pains, like all bodily sensations, are part of the body image. The pain-in-the-foot is literally in the physical space of the brain. (Searle, J., The Rediscovery of the Mind, MIT Press, 1992: p. 63.)

Bennett and Hacker object on grounds of logical grammar: one does not have pains “in the brain.” Pains (other than headaches) are not “in the head.” If there is a locus of pain it is a distributed feature of the whole experience, the brain being only one physical part of it. For the experiencing subject, of course, “His pain is located where he sincerely suggests it is” (p.123) (phantom pains being in need of special explanation). This is not to deny that in the absence of a proper functioning brain, one would feel no pains. But that does not license the claim that pains “are felt either in or by the brain” (p.122). What hurts when one breaks one's leg is typically one's leg, not one's head.

Part III (“Consciousness and Contemporary Neuroscience: An Analysis”) considers the leading work on consciousness as well as neuroscientific efforts to explain the “mystery” of consciousness. McGinn, Dennett, Searle, Chalmers and Nagel are just a few of the many philosophers whose arguments Bennett and Hacker scrutinize with care. Neuroscientists such as Blakemore, Crick, Damasio, Edelman, as well as psychologists such as Baars and Weiskrantz, are given equal treatment, especially their attempts to make the case that the brain is a conscious organ. Absent the brain, of course, there is no consciousness, but ascribing consciousness as such solely to the brain is philosophically suspect.

When it comes to consciousness, no topic will invite more discord than that of qualia. When Nagel asks “What is it like to be a bat?,” Bennett and Hacker answer that the question proceeds from a philosophical confusion. Qualia – the idea that mental states have qualitative characteristics – is but another example of philosophers bewitched by a philosophical pseudoproblem.

These are some of the ideas that Bennett and Hacker are eager to refute:

There is a specific way it feels to hear, smell or “to have mental states” (Block);.
Every conscious state has a certain qualitative feel (Searle);
Each differentiable conscious experience presents a different quale (Edelman and Tononi) (p. 274).

Suppose, we ask a person who has had his sight or hearing restored “How does it feel to see (or hear)?” They are likely to answer “Why, it's wonderful.” What we are asking after is the person's attitude toward his recovery of a faculty, now restored. But what if we ask a person possessed of normal faculties “What is it like to see a chair or a table?” Bennett and Hacker aver that the person would have no idea what we were talking about. Seeing tables and chairs, postboxes and lampposts are all different experiences. But “[t]he experiences differ only in so far as their objects differ” (p. 274).

Some neuroscientists have themselves fallen victim to the logical fallacies of philosophers of consciousness. Damasio, for example, explains vision as the production of mental images in the brain. Bennett and Hacker object that this explanatory model makes no sense, since it raises objections of another kind; the hypothesis that mental images are real features instantiated in the brain would not seem subject to empirical verification and, even if it were, it would fail to illuminate vision as we know it. Of course, there is brain activity associated with vision. But it is unhelpful and of little value to say that “we” perceive the image of the apple produced in our brain. The question Bennett and Hacker ask, “How is it that we see it?” (p. 305) cannot receive philosophical illumination by the question “Where 'in' the brain is the image?” The reason is that that question ignores the all-important one: “Who, or what, is doing the seeing?” The error is in thinking that seeing an object is itself somehow reducible to a quale behind vision. But it is not. And the object of normal vision is not an image of any kind either. Neuroscientists may find inductive correlations between seeing certain items (e.g. lines, corners, curves) and brain activity. But finding such correlations is not the same as reducing one to the other. It is the reduction that leads to a muddle.

Part IV (“On Method”) has two key features. First is a sustained argument against the reductionist impulse of contemporary neuroscience. Second is an explicit articulation and defense of the philosophical method that informs both the critique of reductionism and the perspective of the book as a whole. For philosophers, this second aspect will be the most interesting and surely controversial.

Francis Crick is one neuroscientist who wants to reduce the mental to the physical. His “astonishing hypothesis” that we are “no more than the behavior of a vast assembly of nerve cells and their associated molecules” (Francis Crick, The Astonishing Hypothesis, p. 3 (1995)) is a good example of the sort of explanatory account of human action that Bennett and Hacker reject as metaphysical nonsense.

In the course of reducing the mental to the physical, the normative dimensions of social life are lost. Consider this example. Suppose I place my signature on a document. The act of affixing my signature is accompanied by neural firings in my brain. The neural firings do not “explain” what I have done. In signing my name, I might be signing a check, giving an autograph, witnessing a will or signing a death certificate. In each case the neural firing may well be the same. And yet, the meaning of what I have done in affixing my signature is completely different in each case. These differences are “circumstance dependent,” not merely the product of my neural firings. Neural firings accompany the act of signing but only the circumstances of my signing, including the intention to do so, are the significant factors in explaining what I have done.

Bennett and Hacker conclude their book with two appendices, devoted to a careful study of the work of Daniel Dennett and John Searle, respectively. Dennett adopts the posture of Quine, specifically the thought that philosophical problems can be solved through a combination of scientific inquiry and empirical evidence (p. 414). Dennett's attempt to explain intentionality as an interpretive strategy is grounded in what he refers to as the “Heterophenomenological Method.” Bennett and Hacker argue that the method is a non-starter because it is incoherent (p. 428). Similarly with Dennett's attempt to compare our thinking to computer programs.

In the case of Searle, Bennett and Hacker find much with which they agree. Cartesian dualism, behaviorism, identity theory, eliminative materialism and functionalism are all rejected, and rightly so. Searle advocates “biological naturalism,” the view that consciousness is a biological phenomenon, a proper subject of the biological sciences (p. 444). Bennett and Hacker serve up no objection here. It is when Searle claims that “mental phenomena are caused by neurophysiological processes in the brain and are themselves features of the brain” (Searle, Rediscovery, p. 1) that Bennett and Hacker demur. Searle's claim commits the mereological fallacy discussed earlier. Brains are no more conscious than they are capable of taking a walk or holding a conversation. True, no animal could do either of these things without a properly functioning brain. But it is the person, not the brain, that engages in these activities.

A central feature of philosophy is the clarification of our forms of representation – the ways in which we make statements about the world. In articulating and employing this approach to the philosophical foundations of neuroscience, Bennett and Hacker bring to light defective forms of representation widely employed by some contemporary neuroscientists as well as some philosophers of mind. One of the many strengths of their book lies in its persuasive argument for the inherent distinctiveness of science and philosophy. Another is its clear-headed account of the necessity of philosophy to the proper conduct of science. Sweeping, argumentative and brilliant, this book will provoke widespread discussion among philosophers and neuroscientists alike.