Philosophical Foundations of Property Law

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James Penner and Henry E. Smith (eds.), Philosophical Foundations of Property Law, Oxford University Press, 2013, 369pp., $98.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673582.

Reviewed by Christopher Essert, Faculty of Law, Queen's University


This volume collects thirteen essays on the theory of property law. Most of them (ten, by my count) share an approach to property law which has become prominent over the last twenty or so years. James Penner and Henry Smith, the volume's editors and two prominent proponents of this approach, describe it in their introduction in terms of an "interest in finding a coherent moral-political justification for property rights," a rejection of the 'bundle of rights' approach that dominated the twentieth century (an approach largely skeptical about the very idea of property), and an emphasis on "the importance of property as a doctrinal category" (xvi).

The book is well worth picking up for anyone interested in this approach (or property theory more generally). All the essays are good, and some are outstanding. While most share the approach described above, they do so in quite distinct ways, and their diversity makes it hard to discuss them in any unified way. So I'll say something about each, although for all the obvious reasons I'll have more to say about some than others, and I'll try to bring out at least a few of the many interesting connections between chapters.

The chapters by Jeremy Waldron, Carol Rose, and Stephen Munzer are the three exceptions to the shared approach. Waldron's chapter is on Hume's conventionalist account of property, according to which property rights are a solution to a kind of coordination problem having to do with the efficient use of scarce resources. Hume's theory, like Locke's, is "bottom-up," in the sense that it explains how property rights might arise without a state in effect handing them out from the top down. Waldron suggests that Hume's theory of property deserves more attention than it has gotten and that, because of some of its differences from Locke's better-known view, it might be "a better -- more respectable -- foundational account for property professors to include in their textbooks" (12). Waldron is right that Hume's view does not get explicitly discussed much by property professors, but I wonder how much an explicit discussion would add, given that the dominant law and economics-based approach to property in the legal academy presupposes a picture of property quite similar to Hume's. Rose considers some aspects of the psychology of property, and in particular the way that both owners and non-owners understand property from their own points of view. One of Rose's key suggestions is that property regimes stand or fall largely on the way that they are experienced by non-owners. As always, Rose is an astute observer, and it may be that more philosophical work on property law could benefit from taking her suggestion into account. Munzer mostly revisits an earlier debate with Penner about the bundle-of-rights view of property and asks just what it was a debate about, along the way implicating important general philosophical questions about property theory.

Many of the authors attempt to provide insight into the nature of property law by focussing closely on legal doctrine. Simon Douglas and Ben McFarlane's chapter is the most extreme example of this. They claim, based on their reading of the jurisprudence about owners' not having a general right that others not interfere with the use of what they own, that property rights are necessarily exclusionary rights that others not "interfere with a physical thing" (220, my emphasis). As I've argued elsewhere,[1] not only does this require quite radical revision in both legal and non-legal understanding of what kinds of things we have property rights in, it's also not a valid argument for the conclusion.

One legal doctrine that seems particularly apt for an examination, which will lead to deeper insights into the nature of property, is the law of government takings. In his chapter, Alan Brudner revisits his Hegelian account of property law through the lens of takings law. On Brudner's telling, the kind of takings law exemplified in the Fifth Amendment to the US Constitution -- on which the state can take private owners' property but only when the owner is suitably compensated -- presents a genuine challenge for other views. Views like Locke's, which see property rights as prior to the state, have a hard time explaining the power of eminent domain, and views like Kant's, which see property rights as dependent on the state, can explain the power of eminent domain but have no explanation for the requirement of compensation. Brudner claims that only a Hegelian account can show property as "belonging to the constitution of a well-ordered political community" (74). He traces the development of such an account starting in Abstract Right and moving into what he calls a "dialogical polity," a "holistic entity" of which the public and private sectors are "equally and mutually limiting parts" (95). The law of takings vindicates both of these parts: the power of eminent domain recognizes the fact that "no one may assert a property as an external constraint on state authority," but compensation is owed because private property is not a "product of the public welfare, [so] the public authority has an unqualified duty to respect it" through such compensation (96). The picture Brudner paints is undoubtedly elegant and attractive in many respects (in particular in its claim to render consistent various apparently contradictory aspects of property law). Even if one might reasonably be concerned about some of the rather elaborate Hegelian metaphysics that grounds his project, it must be taken seriously.

Three other chapters can be paired with Brudner's, although in quite different ways. Brian Lee focusses on a particular aspect of takings law, "implicit in-kind compensation" (100), which is about what it sounds like: the idea is that some government takings might be justified by the owner's receiving some other kind of (non-monetary) benefit. Lee considers and rejects a series of broadly economic justifications of the doctrine before proposing an intriguing alternative according to which compensation is owed in some cases not because it makes whole the owner whose property is taken, but rather because it respects "each property owner's status as a civic equal" (127) due a kind of equal concern and respect. And, like Brudner, Eric Claeys and Dennis Klimchuk each use some doctrinal questions as an avenue into the presentation of an important philosopher's account of property. Claeys' doctrine (or set of them) is acquisition, and his philosopher is Locke. His chapter helpfully presents an account of what he calls "productive labor theory," which he rests on the important work on Locke done by political philosophers -- A. John Simmons, Gopal Sreenivasan, James Tully, and others -- in the past twenty years. This is an important corrective in the legal academy, where it sometimes seems that Nozick's theory dominates 'Lockean' scholarship even to the exclusion of Locke's own work. Claeys also applies the Lockean story to various doctrinal questions about how individuals come to own things.

Dennis Klimchuk uses the doctrine of necessity as a way to investigate Grotius' account of property. As Klimchuk shows in his rich and rewarding chapter, necessity has a structure similar to the structure that troubled Brudner about takings: in some circumstances (such as when my life is in danger) I can trespass on your property, so long as I compensate you later for any damage. Grotius' basic thought is that property is a departure from a state of natural equity. But property can be justified only if that departure is kept to a minimum: "the right to exclude may extend only so far as is necessary to realize the ends for the sake of which we adopt private property," (54) where on Grotius' account these ends have to do with the material gains realizable only through an institution of property. (Although, as Klimchuk notes, these ends are "in a sense . . . inessential" to the account, since for Grotius what matters is the permissibility of property once it is up and running rather than the question of whether or not we ought to have it (52).) This requirement that the departures from natural equity be minimized explains the right of necessity, since to allow an owner to exclude another in circumstances of necessity would allow too great a departure from natural equity. At the same time the person exercising the right of necessity needs to compensate the owner, since allowing that right to be exercised without compensation would create the same problem as would denying the right altogether. This provides a really quite interesting way of looking at property and of the right of necessity. Even more interesting is Klimchuk's suggestion that this way of looking at things provides a path towards a justification of property against the charge that it inevitably leads to a problematic kind of inequality. I don't have the space to consider these arguments in detail, but they are well worth looking at.

Klimchuk's concluding section raises an interesting question. He suggests that the right of necessity is a property right. By this he means three things. The first is that the right derives its justification in the same way the rest of our property rights do. If the rest of the account succeeds, Klimchuk is correct about this. But he also says (second) that the right is not a privilege but "a right, under certain limitations, to use a bit of the world" and (third) that the right is not "a personal right" in Pufendorf's sense -- that is, not "a right that another use her property in a particular way" -- but rather "just a right to use the property" (67). But these features are not obviously determinative of the right of necessity's status as a property right: some contract rights, like licenses to enter another's land, seem to have them. What Klimchuk really needs, to show that the right of necessity is a property right, is to show that it holds against third parties. But perhaps he can show this. If A breaks into B's cabin to take food in a snowstorm, can C stop A? If Klimchuk is right that B can't do so, it would be odd, I think, to say that C could. If this is right, and if the Grotian framework can be extended as Klimchuk suggests, perhaps the argument is even more powerful that it seems from his already excellent chapter.

Irit Samet also closely examines doctrine, but differs from some of the other authors in that she explores a doctrine, proprietary estoppel, which is not obviously part of the core of property. On the contrary, as she notes, the doctrine, which very roughly allows that sometimes non-contractual representations made by owners with respect to their property that are relied upon by others will obligate the owners to compensate those others for that reliance, "works to disrupt the good order of property law" (142). Nevertheless, Samet argues, this is a good thing, because the fact that the doctrine creates obligations of this sort promotes an important kind of trusting relationship. And this all seems right, as does her proposed explanation in terms of what she calls "Loss Prevention Assurance" obligations. One quibble with the argument is this: in insisting on the importance of the voluntariness of the representation made by the owner, and pushing an analogy with promises, Samet seems to suggest (134-5) that the owner exercises a legal power in so obligating herself. This is hard to square with the requirement that the other rely to her detriment on the representation, which fits much better with the kind of "tort-like" analysis that Samet rejects (133). It's surely right that there is a voluntary element to proprietary estoppel, but the requirement of reliance means that the owner's obligation is brought about causally rather than normatively, and so cannot be straightforwardly analyzed in terms of legal or normative powers (as they are usually understood following, e.g., Raz's well-known analysis). I think this is an important point, because getting straight on the role of legal powers in property law is important; but as the rest of the chapter shows, Samet's substantive argument would still work were she to abandon this aspect of the view.

Larissa Katz and Lisa Austin both discuss some questions about possession in property law. Katz begins with a close reading of the law of finders. She claims that the rights and obligations of a person who finds another's lost property are illustrative, not (as is usually thought) of the idea that all ownership is relative, but instead of the idea that owners have a distinctive kind of authority over what they own and that sometimes others get this authority on a pro tem basis. Katz then investigates a different set of possessory (but non-proprietary) relationships between individuals with respect to things -- those grounded in privity. Here the thought is that the doctrine of privity allows us to sometimes obligate others not to interfere with objects that we neither own nor physically hold. Katz calls privity "the missing link" (216) between our rights to our selves and full-blown property rights. She seems to mean that they are an "intermediate stage" in a progression from rights in our person to property rights. But, while she seems to me to have demonstrated that privity-based obligations form a distinct category, the progression claim is not, I think, fully spelled out.

Austin argues that the sustained attention property theorists pay to the law of first possession is undue. Her argument is that many of the features of property law that might on first glance appear puzzling become much less so when one remembers (in the spirit of Rawls in "Two Concepts of Rules," which Austin interestingly and helpfully relies on throughout) that they are features of a system of rules, and in particular features of a system of property law, and so partake of the distinctive requirements of a legal order. So Austin (in apparent contrast to Katz) argues that relativity of title is explained by ideas that are "not ideas of ownership but ideas of legal order" (190). Similarly, she claims that the Kantian idea of an omnilateral legal order can explain certain structural features of the private law of property. She also claims that her account can explain the way in which we think owners have a privilege to use their property. Austin argues that what counts as "use" in property depends on the nature of the practice of property (there's Rawls' argument again). In arguing that possession is prior to use here, she reaches a position somewhat similar to Arthur Ripstein's, which I'll consider below.

The volume's editors are both important property scholars, and their chapters each merit attention. Penner makes two sets of arguments about the alienability or transmissibility of property rights. As many have noted, the way in which property rights are not intrinsically the rights of their owners -- what is mine today might be yours tomorrow -- is one of their most distinctive features, and any complete account of property needs to explain this. Penner argues both for a view about what this transmissibility is and for a view about how it might be justified. In the first part of the chapter he dives deeply into the minutiae of just what happens when one person transfers a legal right to another. This is dense, hard going; but it is of great interest to those of us who worry about Hohfeldian minutiae.

The second part of the chapter is less convincing. Penner seeks to show that an owner's power to transfer her property can be justified just by our ability "to respond to facts as reasons" (264) such that conventionalist justifications become otiose. But his various moves raise doubts. For example he cites Seana Shiffrin's defence of anticonventionalism about promising, and appears to cash out her argument in terms of the claim that promising and the like are justified by "the ability of different individuals to respond to the same reason" (265). He then moves on to argue that property could be justified in this same way. This is not Shiffrin's argument: in fact she makes (as she puts it) a transcendental argument for the normative power to promise. Without such a power, she says, we would be unable to understand core parts of our normative lives, in particular our ability to form "minimally morally decent interpersonal relationships."[2]

While I find the possibility of such a transcendental argument for transferable property rights appealing, Penner does not appear to have such an argument up his sleeve. And the bare idea that humans can respond to reasons, together or alone, just does not seem to be able to do the work he needs it to do. For example, he seems to think that the possibility of cooperation by strangers in a state of nature, such as that contemplated in Scanlon's example of the hunters on opposite sides of a river bank, "is no mystery, since it only turns on being responsive to reasons concerning the interests of others," or at least particularly important such reasons (269). Surely this is not enough. Hume thought we could be responsive to such reasons. But he thought that, absent a convention, they would not be strong enough to motivate us to perform the sorts of obligations to others that we sometimes seem to think we have. Seeing you across the river, having thrown my boomerang back and hoping that I'll return the favour with your spear, might give me some reason to do so. But I'm hungry and with a spear and a boomerang I'm sure to get something for dinner tonight. Without more it's not at all clear how Penner thinks that my ability to appreciate the reason your interests give me could ground the obligatory force that seems present here.

Smith's chapter is in some respects a recapitulation of the important body of work on the law of property that he has produced over the past fifteen years. In much of that work, Smith has highlighted the importance of information costs to various questions about the law of property. On his telling, much of property law is shaped by the value of making it easier (or cheaper) for individuals to know about their legal obligations in respect of what others own. Here Smith makes some roughly similar points by conceiving of property law in terms of the concepts, where concepts are understood as "modes of presentation" (322), ways of picking out or organizing external features of the world.

His basic thought goes: we can understand the traditional in rem concept of property law, say, A's right that nobody else use or interfere with A's land (call it 'Blackacre'), as a concept that we use to organize a much more complicated set of external particulars, namely all of the potential "quadruples" of the form {right-holder, duty-owed, action, resource attribute} (324). We could have a property law that spells out all such quadruples, as Smith claims the bundle-of-rights picture finally wants to do, but such a property law would be extremely informationally demanding. Rather than knowing just that A has a right that nobody else enter Blackacre, we would need to know whether each of A and B and C (and . . . ) had a right that each of X and Y and Z (and . . . ) not walk on Mondays or fly a kite on Tuesdays or have a picnic on Wednesdays (or . . . ) on the easternmost square foot of Blackacre, or six feet in the air above the westernmost square foot (or . . . ). This much more fine-grained breakdown would be extensionally equivalent to the traditional concept, but -- and here is Smith's core idea -- it would be significantly more costly for everyone. So Smith argues that the traditional concept of property has the form that it does for functionalist reasons having to do primarily with information costs.

As I noted, Smith has drawn (and continues to draw) many different conclusions from his basic idea. One is that the traditional concept of property, which is framed primarily in terms of a right to exclude others from what one owns, is a "rough and approximate" way that property law tries to achieve its ultimate purpose, which is serving our interest in the use of things (330). Ripstein challenges this aspect of Smith's view head on. For Ripstein, possession comes first, not use. The law of property has an "authority structure" (169), which is to say it embodies a bilateral normativity according to which owners have the right to exclude non-owners, or, put correlatively, non-owners owe owners a duty not to interfere with their property. And this authority is broad, in that while there are certain limited situations (like necessity) in which owners must let non-owners use their property, in general, owners' authority over their property is pretty near absolute. Ordinarily, the fact that an owner's use of her land is inefficient or suboptimal or just plain dumb doesn't matter. What matters is that the owner, rather than someone else, is the one who has "a right to determine how [her] property will be used" (160). Normally, justifications of property include some attempt at explaining this feature of property away or at least explaining it as an indirect or second-best way for the law to encourage beneficial or productive uses of resources. And, as I mentioned, Smith's information-costs story is a version of this kind of justification: by giving owners the right to exclude others, the law makes it easier and cheaper for everyone to know what they can and cannot do. For Smith, exclusion is a means to the end of encouraging valued uses.

Ripstein disagrees. He puts the point in different ways, but a helpful one is this: the explaining-away strategy that Smith's account exemplifies assumes "that the values underlying property are themselves characterizable without reference to property-like concepts" (164). Ripstein thinks that the authority structure that property has -- where what is wrong when you use my property is not that you bring about some bad state of affairs but that you use my property -- just cannot be reduced in the way that Smith (and others) want. He analogizes this claim to a similar one about spatial relations: the thought that A is to the left of B is fundamentally relational and cannot be explained just in terms of some monadic property of A. Similarly, your wronging me by using my property is fundamentally relational and cannot be explained just in terms of some monadic property of you (or your action).

I think this is an absolutely crucial argument for understanding the nature of property law. However, while I think Ripstein is certainly correct about the form of property rights, the account he offers does leave some important questions unanswered. One is whether an observation about the form of property rights can stand as a justification of property rights. Ripstein is sensitive about this -- noting that one might worry that he has "simply refused to accept" his burden of justification (174) and, importantly, that "if they are to have any normative significance, property rights must solve some sort of problem that somebody could somehow think required a solution" (163). Ripstein takes himself to have done this: "each property owner is master of his or her property, as against all others. That is the justification of the rule in property. . . . the form of interaction . . . has moral significance" (176).

But when it comes down to it, I think Ripstein might still be faulted for not answering a different question of justification (or at least not doing so here). The point might be put this way: Ripstein has justified property rights but not property rights. The passage I last quoted comes in a section of the argument in which Ripstein analogizes the form of property rights to the form of the rights we have over our bodies, which have the same kind of authority structure. But while it's pretty appealing to think we have rights of that form over our bodies, it's much less obvious why we must have rights of that form over external things. Indeed, the formal authority structure that Ripstein shows that property rights have might be thought to make it more difficult to justify property rights: why should we have an institution that allows individuals to extend the authority they have over themselves to anything else? Why think that the moral significance that this form of interaction has when it comes to our selves extends to land or bicycles or hats? This strikes me as a central question in property theory, and it seems that any full justification of property must provide an answer. (Elsewhere Ripstein has defended Kant's answer to this question, according to which it would be morally wrong for us not to extend our rights to our selves in this way.[3] But he does not mention that argument here.)

To close, let me return to Smith's chapter. As I mentioned above, Smith thinks that in a world without information costs, we could have a property law that spelled out each quadruple {right-holder, duty-owed, action, resource attribute} rather than grouping them together as we do now. His thought here is that property law saves on information costs by "defining things" (334) as it groups these quadruples together. As I read Smith, these quadruples could each have the authority structure that Ripstein demonstrates is part of property. Which suggests that Ripstein -- or anyone who shares his view of the structure of the law -- needs a story such as Smith's to explain why the quadruples are grouped together as they are. Why, that is, does the right to walk on Blackacre necessarily travel with the right to have a picnic on it? An obvious answer is that the quadruples are grouped together using our normal concepts of things in the world; there is nothing special about property law in this regard. And this is a plausible answer when we limit the discussion to property in land and tangibles, as pretty much everyone in this volume does. But property rights -- with the authority structure Ripstein discusses -- might be plausibly thought to extend far beyond tangibles, to things like copyright, patents, trademarks, or commercial exploitation of personality. One hopes that this volume's authors might turn their collective attention to those cases as well. In the meantime, this book presents the state of the art philosophical thinking about property law and is required reading for anyone with interests in the field.

[1] Christopher Essert, “Property in Licenses and the Law of Things” (2014) 59 McGill Law Journal 559, 574-581.

[2] Seana Valentina Shiffrin, “Promising, Intimate Relationships, and Conventionalism” (2008) 117 Philosophical Review 481, 498-9.

[3] Arthur Ripstein, Force And Freedom (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2009).