Philosophical Foundations of the Law of Torts

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John Oberdiek (ed.), Philosophical Foundations of the Law of Torts, Oxford University Press, 2014, 447pp., $98.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780198701385.

Reviewed by Avihay Dorfman, Tel Aviv University


The law of torts is widely recognized as one key pillar of private law, which is to say the law that governs the terms of horizontal interactions among persons. Whereas contract law governs certain types of consensual interactions, the law of torts mainly occupies itself with involuntary forms of interactions and, in particular, the duties that attach to those whose activities render vulnerable the legitimate interests of other people, including those who are outside the privity of a joint enterprise. In that, tort law amalgamates otherwise discrete torts into one unity, namely, the law of torts. For the past several decades, the theoretical study of tort law has proceeded by implicit or explicit rejection of the thought that the law at issue just is a purely contingent political fact. Instead, the positive law of torts is better understood as a rich repository of conceptual and normative insights capable of placing some constraints on what lawmakers can do and on what private persons can demand from one another. According to this theoretical tradition, the doctrines that the legal community and others commonly understand as tort law's are (at least potentially) microcosms of fundamental normative principles. Thus, the law of torts has been closely studied and sophisticatedly reconstructed, using philosophical, economic, and certain other established methodologies, in an effort to articulate the character, general principles, and normative commitments that underlie the rights and the duties that figure in this body of law.

To this extent, this book provides a collection of illuminating essays on important questions -- though certainly not all of these are, in fact, foundational ones -- concerning the organizing ideas and normative ideals that underlie the law of torts. Indeed, John Oberdiek has assembled nineteen thoughtful essays and provided an extremely helpful introduction, which together make an important contribution to the ongoing enterprise of understanding and evaluating tort law (and private law, more generally). The volume demonstrates that philosophical analysis (properly conceived) can be part of what it takes to address the two most basic questions of tort theory: "what is" (i.e., what values, if any, are immanent in tort law) and "what should be" (i.e., what values should inform this law). For this reason, the volume should be of interest not only to lawyers and legal scholars, but also to political and moral philosophers, and political scientists (among others).

But in spite of all that, the volume as a whole suffers from a serious shortcoming: it fails to do justice to two of the most important theoretical approaches to tort law -- corrective justice and economic analysis of law. As a result, the overall impression is that the volume both underestimates the relevance of these two approaches to many of the questions with which it engages, and overestimates the novelty of some of the answers it seeks to provide in response. Or so I shall argue with respect to some key contributions to this volume.

Begin with the observation that the two most ambitious approaches to the theoretical study of modern tort law are the ones developed by lawyer economists and corrective justice theorists. I say most ambitious to emphasize their respective attempts to develop comprehensive accounts of the substance -- and, so, the normative foundations -- of the rights and the duties that figure in the law of torts.[1] In that, the economic analysis of tort law and corrective justice address the questions of what rights and duties participants in the tort practice have and, ultimately, why they have them. Very briefly, the former takes welfare in the aggregate to underwrite, and indeed determine, the existence and the content of the various duties that tort law imposes -- on the economic approach, these duties are surface manifestations of the generic duty not to engage in actions whose social costs exceed their benefits. Lawyer economists have worked out the implications of this generic duty for the explanation and evaluation of many pieces of tort doctrine and of tort law, in general. The latter approach is in fact a class of various different approaches. I shall only focus on its most comprehensive development -- on this view of corrective justice, the law of torts (or private law, more broadly) constitutes the systematic realization of formal equality among formally independent persons. Here, too, a substantive theory of the underlying concept(s) of rights and duties generates the normative framework within which the law of torts can be explained and assessed. Precisely because of their shared ambition to develop (including by way of exploring, interpreting, or reconstructing) the foundational normative commitments of tort law, both approaches are highly influential in the Anglo-American world. It would therefore be appropriate to suspect that their omission might have some troubling consequences for the volume's own ambition to deepen and broaden our understanding of tort law's philosophical foundations. In particular, I shall mention two kinds of consequence: a meta-theoretical one and a substantive one.

The Law's Self-Presentation: Fundamental or Epiphenomenal?

There may be any number of reasons for excluding economic approaches, some of which can be purely contingent and pragmatic. But there is probably also a principled one, namely, that the theoretical accounts of tort law produced by lawyer economists fail to meet the threshold of what could count as an adequate explanation and justification of tort law (or of its core doctrines). This indictment has been developed, separately, by two leading philosophers of tort law, Jules Coleman and Ernest Weinrib, and has become part of the canon of the entire class of non-consequentialist approaches to tort law. The source of this indictment is that lawyer economists fail to take seriously what can be called the law's self-presentation. In using this term, I do not mean to suggest that law is an anthropomorphic entity; the term is rather a placeholder for an ongoing practice of the relevant legal community. Thus, there are the judges (especially in the common law tradition) who are in charge of incrementally developing the organizing doctrines, concepts, and ideas of the law of torts. Next, lawyers engage in a dialogue with courts and clients and, so, participate in a process of interpreting and applying legal doctrine in the face of changing circumstances and normative perceptions. Other important members of this community are torts professors and commentators who can exert their influence by producing scholarship and, no less important, by educating future generations of torts lawyers and judges. At any rate, the law's self-presentation reflects a sympathetic reconstruction of what members of the relevant legal community would, if it could, answer in response to the question of what tort law is. Against this backdrop, the economic analysis of law is often criticized for explaining away the express reasoning, doctrines, and concepts that figure prominently in the practice of tort law.

But then an interesting -- and, to my mind, insufficiently explored -- question arises: why it is that only the law's self-presentation could render tort law intelligible. In particular, accusing lawyer economists of failing to meet this bar does not engage them or their methodological and normative commitments seriously. My argument does not return to the familiar view that economic analysis is both functional and reductive; it surely is. Rather, it is the Benthamite tradition that implicitly informs their commitment to epiphenomenalism with respect to legal concepts and doctrines. On this view, economic analysis of law seeks to demystify tort law's self-presentation in order to expose to the bright light of reason what courts are actually doing when they "invoke" such concepts upon deciding cases. Economic analysis, it is often argued by lawyer economists, goes beyond the law's self-presentation in an effort to say what considerations are necessary, rather than merely sufficient, to explain the judgment courts make. These considerations could then be used to re-characterize (or even de-characterize) the existing doctrines to reflect the implicit economic logic that lawyer economists find, or expect to find, when they look at what the courts do, rather than at what they say they are doing.

The debate between those who take the law's self-presentation as fundamental and those who adopt epiphenomenalism is far from being exhausted. Certainly, it will not do to criticize lawyer economists from the point of view of the law's self-presentation.[2] And the prominence of the economic analysis of tort law nowadays only promises that the debate is not going to wither away anytime soon. Moreover, and more importantly, it would be a mistake to suppose that this debate is reducible to a disagreement between non-consequential and consequential approaches to tort law (or between non-reductive and reductive approaches to tort law). Epiphenomenalism is a meta-ethical commitment that can be adopted, to some extent, by non-consequential approaches, too.[3] Furthermore, some measure of healthy skepticism concerning the law's self-presentation may sometimes be necessary to unearth the law's distorted or imprecise self-presentation. It is, therefore, surprising to see that a meta-ethical divide that pervades contemporary tort theory goes virtually unaddressed in a volume dedicated to the philosophical foundations of tort law.

The Character, Scope, and Ambition of Corrective Justice

Unlike the economic approach to tort law, corrective justice receives some attention in this volume. Some of the most important contributions to take up the theory of corrective justice consist in essays that seek to (1) fill out the content of the duties of fair interactions to which tort law give rise; (2) reconstruct the theory of corrective justice in a way that exposes its inherent commitment to distributive justice; and (3) emphasize the centrality of tort law's remedial aspect. It is here that the volume's engagement with corrective justice does not fully appreciate the character, scope, and ambition of the theory of corrective justice, properly conceived. I shall take each of them in turn.

(1) Corrective justice and fair terms of interactions. In his ambitious essay, Oberdiek prepares the ground for a novel account of the first-order duties that govern the terms of the interactions among risk-creators and risk-takers. He does that by defending the suitability and desirability of the doctrine of contractualism developed by Scanlon in moral theory to the morality of tort law. Oberdiek begins from the formal insight made by corrective justice theorists, according to which tort law structures a relationship between "two litigants" in which "doing and suffering constitute a single integrated sequence in which the justificatory considerations that bear on the doer necessarily bear on the sufferer as well."[4] The bipolar relationship at issue need not be limited to the stage of correcting or redressing a prior wrong -- a common mistake (to which I return below) is to suppose that a theory of corrective justice is, or must be, confined to the stage of correcting a prior injustice. Rather, the source of the bipolar structure of tort law is the relational character of the substantive rights and duties to which tort law gives rise, such as the right that you, rather than merely society as a collective entity, will display reasonable vigilance of my life and limb.

The next two stages of the Scanlonian-inspired argument, however, might generate substantial uncertainties as to where the argument goes (or could go). Oberdiek (presumably) seeks to set his project apart from corrective justice by saying that "no corrective justice theory even attempts to offer [a substantive account of tort law's primary obligations]" (105). It is of course true that some corrective justice theories focus almost exclusively on the secondary obligations that arise in tort law, such as the duty to make monetary compensation. However, it is simply false to claim that all corrective justice theories are like that. Some of the most familiar theories of corrective justice these days take the question of fair terms of interactions -- the primary obligations in Oberdiek's terminology -- to figure prominently in their accounts of tort law. They do so, for example, by drawing on Kant's doctrine of private right,[5] Hegel's counterpart doctrine,[6] or otherwise.[7] Perhaps the ideal of formal freedom and equality that underlies these (and possible other) attempts may not be appealing (as I shall claim below). But this charge is remarkably different from the one made by Oberdiek. The third stage of the argument, then, becomes crucial. For, it is not clear whether the Scanlonian turn would open up a new horizon for explaining and evaluating the normative substance of tort law (that is, in addition to the ones covered by corrective justice and economic analysis of tort law).Oberdiek, whose presentation of Scanlon's contractualism is admirably concise and thoughtful, seems to be optimistic about this possibility, although he does not demonstrate why this should be the case.

The suspicion that arises at this preliminary stage of developing a Scanlonian theory of tort law is the following. The organizing idea behind Scanlon's moral theory of contractualism is that "an act is wrong if its performance under the circumstances would be disallowed by any set of principles for the general regulation of behavior that no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced general agreement" (quoted by Oberdiek, 113). Now the crucial question is whether this idea is best seen as an account of the structure of moral thought, rather than one that also generates a theory of the substantive considerations that bear on the question of what counts as "reasonable rejection." It is not clear, for example, how aScanlonian principle of reasonable rejectability could determine, out of its own normative materials, the content of the duty against committing trespass to land, the standard of due care or, say, address the question of whether there should be tort liability in cases of negligent infliction of pure economic loss (i.e., financial loss without antecedent harm to the person or property of the plaintiff), and so on. Hence, the worry is that corrective justice or some other sophisticated account of the normative substance -- an account of the underlying conception(s) of the rights at issue -- will do the heavy-lifting, in which case the Scanlonian turn may amount to offering a re-statement of the familiar observation that the structure of tort law is fundamentally bipolar.

(2) Distributing Corrective justice. The form of justice called corrective justice is typically presented as distributive justice's rival form. Against this backdrop, the claims made, separately, by John Gardner and Hanoch Sheinman are presented as somewhat revolutionary. Indeed, Gardner argues that some considerations of distributive justice are the necessary outgrowth of pursuing corrective justice -- and he takes this position to be "diametrically opposed" (337) to the view defended elsewhere by Weinrib, a leading corrective justice theorist. According to Weinrib, considerations of corrective and distributive justice cannot be put together in any coherent fashion. And Shienman argues that, contrary to the commonly held view of corrective justice theorists, "tort law's justice" has a "genuinely distributive nature" (355). That said, it is important to be clear about the precise terms of the disagreement between the two contributions, on the one hand, and the theory of corrective justice, on the other. The true disagreement is on the kind of "distributive justice" considerations that could figure in tort law, rather than on whether "distributive justice" considerations are admissible at all.

To begin with, the basic insight developed by both Gardner and Sheinman comes from their insistence on evaluating the justness of tort law, in part, by reference to the opportunities and effects this law creates (or eliminates) for the entire class of participants in the tort practice. Both essays focus on opportunities and effects that arise in connection with the availability of a cause of action in tort and with the remedial apparatus that courts facilitate. For this reason, Gardner contrasts doing "justice between parties" with his observation that "doing justice between the parties . . . cannot but entail consideration of whether the plaintiff belongs to a class of people who should enjoy a right to proceed in tort against the defendant" (342).

However, it is not clear to me whether or not this way of characterizing the judge's mode of reasoning must be inconsistent with at least the spirit of the theory of corrective justice. This may come as a surprise since corrective justice theorists (as just noted) are often reluctant to admit the relevance of considerations of distributive justice to the explanation and evaluation of tort law. But these theorists simply understand the character and scope of "distributive justice" in qualitatively different ways than both Gardner and Sheinman do. Evidence for this can be discerned from the importance of systematicity in leading accounts of tort law as corrective justice.[8] According to these, the practice of corrective justice proceeds along two dimensions: the decision made in the course of solving a particular tort dispute must, in principle, radiate outwards from the parties in that case to the rest of society. To this extent, the theory of corrective justice "characterizes the conceptual structure in which each person's entitlement to use his or her own means is constrained by a like entitlement on the part of others."[9] As a result, it may be said that "distributive justice" considerations arising in the course of correcting injustices are endogenous, rather than exogenous, to a practice of correct justice properly so called.

But there is another way to explain the terms of the disagreement between the Gardner/Sheinman contributions and the theory of corrective justice they both criticize. And on this explanation, the disagreement is genuine and highly important even if it does not turn on the distinction between distributive and corrective justice. Indeed, the actual debate concerns the kind of "distributive" considerations that could govern the realization of systematicity in tort law. It is quite clear that both Gardner/Sheinman and corrective justice theorists are reluctant to commit tort law to robust redistribution of resources or opportunities along Dworkinian or Rawlsian lines. The debate, instead, revolves around the question of whether the "distributive" considerations necessary to achieve systematicity can transcend the demands of formal equality. Corrective justice theorists (such as Weinrib and Ripstein) cast the legitimate authority of courts (or legislatures) to achieve systematicity in terms of pinning down in an impartial manner the pre-political demands of formal equality and freedom. By contrast, both Gardner and Sheinman allow for a more generous approach to the character and the scope of the discretion that judges and legislatures can exercise in the course of correcting injustices, in which case formal equality may count as one consideration among others.

(3) The remedialistic conception of tort law. Contemporary tort theory sometimes creates the impression that "tort law" is, at its core, tort adjudication or, more specifically, a court-run process in which the judge decides whether the victim is entitled to some remedial response (usually compensatory damages) at her injurer's expense. Various different articulations of this remedialistic conception of tort law abound.[10] They are of a piece insofar as they take the right (or power) of the victim and its correlative duty (or liability) of the injurer to redress her injury either to fix the identity of tort law or to count as its necessary and important implication. Arguably, some essays in the volume may be read in this light, too. Presumably, the essays that seem to cast tort law's core in terms of the right to receive monetary compensation, constrained right to a bloodless revenge, or the taking of responsibility for negligent infliction of some loss fall within the remedialistic conception of tort law (because they each attempt to answer the normative question of "why tort law," but in fact ask the different question of why we should have a system of tort liability).[11] Likewise, a claim announcing that "tort law's justice is fully distributive as well as fully corrective," but in fact reduces "tort law" to a set of remedial rights of redress may be read as making a similar assumption about tort law's core (354).

That said, the remedialistic conception of tort law picks out a non-ideal theory of the importance of tort law.[12] Tort law is important (in the right sense) because we occupy an unjust world in which people fail to comply with their primary duties of care and respect toward the rights of others. But tort law can be immensely important (again, in the right sense) even when our society is perfectly just. An ideal theory of tort law is not a theory about the absence of conflicting interests, but rather a theory of conflict among people who recognize the tension between their respective interests. Tort law perfects, and in some cases even makes possible, this recognition by determining the basic terms of interactions, including discrete interactions between complete strangers. Some of the debates between lawyer economists and corrective justice theorists revolve around the content of the basic terms of interaction set by tort law. Indeed, both approaches aspire to go beyond a non-ideal theory of tort law. Remedialism should therefore be put in its right context, namely, as tort law's fallback plan -- a derivative mechanism, really -- in the case that the reasons offered by tort law have been compromised or neglected by their addressees. So understood, the remedial apparatus that figures so prominently in tort law may perhaps represent the most immediate way to complete the transition from the ideal to the non-ideal theory of tort law. But the further thought -- that it is an essential, definitional, or core property of tort law -- hardly follows.

Moving Forward: In Search of New Normative Foundations of Tort Law

Many essays in the volume seem to be motivated, implicitly or explicitly, by a desire not merely to deepen our understanding of existing accounts of the normative substance of tort law, but also by a desire to broaden this field, in particular, by developing novel accounts of the substantive foundations of tort law. One might speculate that what accounts for the latter desire is the fact that the two major accounts of tort law's normative substance, corrective justice and economic analysis, take formal equality and aggregate welfare as their respective regulative ideals.[13] As I have argued in the preceding discussion with respect to some of the essays, it remains to be seen whether the volume will set the stage for novel theoretical approaches to the explanation and evaluation of tort law. In the last paragraph, I shall seek to identify, rather than pursue, one key point that might be very useful for the purpose of thinking beyond the theoretical frameworks established by corrective justice and economic analysis of tort law.

I conclude with some comments on moving past the corrective versus distributive justice dichotomy. Most philosophical accounts of torts hold the view that tort law expresses a commitment to either corrective justice or distributive justice, or, as in Gardner's and Sheinman's essays, a mix of both. To this extent, tort theorists who seek to defend the morality of tort law by elaborating its commitment to justice, presuppose, explicitly or implicitly, that the normative space occupied by tort theory consists in corrective and distributive justice. The normative substance that is said to underlie corrective justice is a non-comparative conception of equality among formally free persons. By contrast, distributive justice picks out the fair allocation of the costs of discharging primary obligations (such as due care) and secondary ones (such as a duty of repair) according to some measure of merit. As argued elsewhere, the dichotomization of corrective justice and distributive justice and, by extension, the debate over whose side tort law ought to take is misguided.[14] There exists another form of justice, relational justice, and its normative substance is best understood in terms of a non-distributive conception of substantive, rather than formal, justice. Relational justice can (arguably) render tort law's aspiration to do justice between individual persons both intelligible -- in a way that distributive justice's collectivistic aspirations cannot -- and normatively attractive -- in a way that corrective justice's commitment to formal freedom and equality cannot. To this extent, the liberal commitment to substantive equality is just as crucial to our horizontal involuntary relationships -- viz., the domain picked out by the modern law of torts -- as to our vertical ones -- viz., fundamental constitutional rights.

[1] Of course, not all self-identified corrective justice theorists display this ambition.

[2] This form of criticism is represented in this volume in Oberdiek's Introduction (e.g., p. 2, 6) and his essay, "Structure and Justification in Contractualist Tort Theory", p. 110.

[3] And vice versa: accounting for the law's self-presentation need not be foreign to economic approaches.

[4] Ernest Weinrib, The Idea of Private Law (Harvard University Press, 1995), p. 206.

[5] Weinrib, Idea; Weinrib, Corrective Justice (Oxford University Press, 2012), ch. 8; Arthur Ripstein, Equality, Responsibility, and the Law (Cambridge University Press, 1999);Ripstein, Force and Freedom: Kant's Legal and Political Philosophy (Harvard University Press, 2009).

[6] Alan Brudner with Jennifer M. Nadler, The Unity of the Common Law (Oxford University Press, 2013), 2nd ed.

[7] Robert Stevens, Torts and Rights (Oxford University Press, 2007).

[8] See, e.g., Weinrib, "Private Law and Public Right", U. Toronto L.J. 61 (2011): 191, p. 196 concerning the court's "omnilateral authority" to extend "the significance of the decision beyond the specific [tort law] dispute." See also Ripstein, Force and Freedom, pp. 238, 251-2.

[9] Ripstein, "Civil Recourse and Separation of Wrongs and Remedies", Fla. St. U. L. Rev. 39 (2011): 163, p. 181.

[10] By contrast, the leading civil recourse theorists make clear (in John Goldberg and Benjamin Zipursky, "Tort Law and Responsibility", p. 27) that tort law is not reducible to remedies or, indeed, civil recourse. On their view, tort law is the law of private wrongs as much as it is the law of civil recourse. However, my argument against the remedialistic conception of tort law implies that this characterization might not appreciate the normative hierarchy that exists between the law of wrongs and of civil recourse. Only the former, or some variation on the former, can capture or otherwise reflect the distinctive core of tort law.

[11] See Mark Geistfeld, "Compensation as a Tort Norm", Scott Hershovitz,"Tort as a Substitute for Revenge", and David Enoch, "Tort Liability and Taking Responsibility",respectively.

[12] I borrow the methodological notions of non-ideal and ideal theory from Rawls. See John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Harvard University Press, 1971), pp. 8-9, 245-47.

[13] For a more elaborate analysis and for an alternative account, see Avihay Dorfman, Negligence and Accommodation: On Taking Others as They Really Are (unpublished manuscript); Hanoch Dagan and Avihay Dorfman, The Justice of Private Law (unpublished manuscript).

[14] Dagan and Dorfman, The Justice of Private Law; Dorfman, Private Law Exceptionalism? Part II: A Basic Difficulty with the Argument from Formal Equality (unpublished manuscript).