Philosophical Foundations of the Nature of Law

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Wil Waluchow and Stefan Sciaraffa (eds.), Philosophical Foundations of the Nature of Law, Oxford University Press, 2013, 361pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199675517.

Reviewed by Brian H. Bix, University of Minnesota


This impressive collection of papers is based on a conference held in May 2011 at McMaster University. It contains fourteen papers plus an introduction by the editors and conference organizers; three of the papers were commissioned especially for the published volume. According to the editors, the book covers four themes: (1) the traditional debate between natural law theory and legal positivism (with Ronald Dworkin’s legal theory as a third option, critical of legal positivism but distinct from traditional natural law theory); (2) the role of coercion within law; (3) questions of methodology, including issues regarding the use of conceptual analysis; and (4) possible novel methods and new directions for legal theory. While it is not possible to do justice to a collection of this size and significance in the space allotted, this review will attempt to offer comments, inevitably brief and perhaps conclusory, on many of the collection’s articles.

Mark C. Murphy offers what he labels a “weak natural law thesis.” The assertion is that “being a rational standard” is a requirement for a law to be “non-defective.” As a “weak” natural law thesis, this view contrasts with a “strong” natural law thesis that would make “being a rational standard” or some other moral test a requirement for something to be law at all (the slogan often associated, rightly or wrongly, with natural law theory, that is “an unjust law is no law at all”). Thus, for Murphy, when a law fails at being a rational standard, it then is a “defective law,” but still law. Murphy offers incisive arguments, based on an Aristotelian “hypothetical necessity” analysis, to show how this weak natural law position can both explain why some natural law theorists ultimately move to a strong natural law position, and why legal positivists might be forced to see their views (about the primacy of a sources-only-based understanding of legal validity), not as a claim about the “identity conditions” of what it takes to be law, but only as a claim about it might take to “realize” law.

Arie Rosen, in the course of a critique of Joseph Raz’s theory of the nature of law -- arguing that Raz’s analysis focuses improperly on what would make law a legitimate authority when it should focus instead on what makes law a de facto authority -- supports a methodological approach that emphasizes “the practical matrix of our idea of law.” In a way this argument parallels (in a way not discussed by Rosen) Raz’s own view that theories of law are theories about how the concept of law fits in with other concepts in our collective self-understanding. However, Rosen’s approach would have us focus on social practices, within which (e.g.) there is a greater tie between “law” and institutions perceived to be justified than legal positivists like Raz admit.

Kenneth Einar Himma offers to fill in a perceived gap in H. L. A. Hart’s well-known theory of law. As Himma points out, Hart grounded his theory of law on a social practice theory of rules: rules exist when individuals accept a rule as giving them reasons for action (and grounds for criticizing deviations from the rule). However, when Hart built his theory of law, he held that a legal system exists when officials accept the foundational rules of the system, and he said little about citizens’ obligations. As an important methodological move, Himma argues that theories of legal obligation should track the usual understandings and practices of legal officials and citizens, or face a strong burden of justifying deviation from those usual understandings and practices. Himma argues (correctly, I think) that Hart’s focus had been on explaining whether and how law creates legal obligations, not moral obligations.

At first glance, how law creates legal obligations for citizens would not seem mysterious: just as the normative system of the rules of the game of chess create what one might call “chess reasons,” surely in the same way the normative system of law creates legal reasons. However, the rules of chess only create reasons for those who choose to play. What about law? Hart does speak about law creating reasons for those who accept the law (as giving them reasons for action) -- which seems true, by definition -- but what about everyone else? Himma reports that Hart follows the conventional understanding of assuming that the law creates (legal) obligations for all citizens -- regardless of whether those citizens accept the law. Himma’s reading of Hart is that a legal system creates legal obligations for its citizens when the citizens acquiesce to the system of norms, a passive acceptance of the norms combined with a willingness to conform generally to those norms, and this is combined with coercive enforcement of the norms.

It is not easy to discern how ambitious, or how controversial, Himma’s ultimate conclusions are. The argument is grounded on the general practice of speaking of “legal obligations” even for citizens who do not accept their legal system as legitimate or as giving them (separate) reasons for action. However, under this practice, it is not clear that anything follows from claiming that citizens have a legal obligation, other than the fact that they are in a functioning legal system. (Many of the Hart’s and Himma’s criteria concern whether there are officials that accept and act upon the legal system’s foundational norms, including enforcement through coercion or other significant social pressure, and whether the citizens generally conform to that legal system’s prescriptions). Determining the existence conditions of legal systems is of independent philosophical significance (and the Hartian answer here is controversial), as is distinguishing legal obligations from other normatively significant legal actions (e.g., permissions, authorizations, and powers). However, one still might be concerned that “having a legal reason to do X” seems to mean more than that there is a norm prescribing X in a functioning legal system. Himma asserts or assumes that there are “no other kinds of basic reason other than prudential, moral and possibly aesthetic reasons” (181), but that may be a too-quick conclusion on a difficult foundational question.

The conventional view for a long time was that if a government was legitimate, citizens had a moral obligation to obey its laws. In recent decades, some theorists have argued that though a legitimate government had the right to enact laws and enforce those laws through coercive sanctions, citizens might not have a general moral obligation to obey even in this context. Robert C. Hughes goes one step further, arguing that whether legitimate governments have a right to coerce compliance with their (just) legal rules must turn on a case-by-case determination. This is basically the mirror image of the argument that the moral obligation to obey legal rules should be a case-by-case determination, varying not only from one rule to another but also from one citizen to another. Hughes’ argument is that coercive enforcement of law inevitably risks harm to innocent people, and whether there is a benefit to be obtained to offset that moral cost depends on how morally flawed the populace is and how important universal (or near-universal) compliance with the particular law would be. Thus, whether coercive enforcement of the law is justified would likely vary from society to society and from one legal rule to another.

Andrei Marmor’s contribution is simultaneously important, controversial, persuasive, and sometimes frustrating. It begins with the radical claim: “Analytical legal philosophy is not an exercise in conceptual analysis” (209). This is meant both as a descriptive claim and a normative claim. On the descriptive side, Marmor argues that, contrary to wide belief, conceptual analysis was not central to Hart’s theory of law (but did have some role). On the normative side, Marmor parts ways with other prominent analytical legal theorists (and legal positivists), like Raz and Jules Coleman, in arguing that theories of law should not be analyses of the concept “law.” Marmor argues that the legal positivists (including Hart and John Austin) are better understood as putting forward a reductionist claim that law can be explained in terms of something more foundational.

 Central to Marmor’s reading of Hart’s theory as essentially reductionist is the argument that Hart’s focus on the “internal point of view” is not a critique of Austin’s reductionism. Rather, it is a response to Hans Kelsen’s anti-reductionism, in that the internal point of view asserts that people’s acceptance of the law can be “cashed out” in terms of social facts (convergence of behavior combined with criticism for non-compliance). Given Hart’s insistence elsewhere that his work was “hermeneutic” and a rejection of “reduction” in legal theory, this interpretation may require more evidence and argument than Marmor has space to offer here. (In Marmor’s defense, one of Hart’s comments on reduction, in the “Introduction” to his 1983 Essays in Jurisprudence and Philosophy, occurred in the context of summarizing his criticisms of the more radically reductive theories of the Scandinavian legal realists, and one might reject that version of reduction in legal theory while endorsing a different type of reductive theory.) Marmor argues that conceptual analysis cannot amount to much more than exploration of the semantic meaning of terms, thus ultimately agreeing with the critics of conceptual analysis in legal philosophy.

It is frustrating that the critique of conceptual analysis strangely offers only the most tangential references to the best-known defenses of that approach in legal theory, including those of Raz, Coleman, and Julie Dickson, and the text here never fully takes on the arguments of those theorists. And when Marmor summarizes Hart’s view to show why it was clearly not conceptual analysis, the summary seems to fit as easily under the rubric “conceptual analysis” as under the rubric, “reduction”: “[Hart’s theory] is an attempt to explain what constitutes legal practices and institutions, what makes it the case that people regard some such practices as legal while others they do not” (p. 217). Nonetheless, Marmor’s critique of conceptual analysis in legal theory remains powerful. An interesting aspect of his contribution that goes beyond this critique is an exploration of whether and how interpretivist approaches to law (like those of Dworkin, Nicos Stavropoulos, and Mark Greenberg) can be seen as engaging legal positivist theories, as opposed to answering entirely different theoretical questions or starting from entirely different assumptions.

A more sympathetic approach to conceptual analysis is found in Natalie Stoljar’s contribution, which builds on Sally Haslanger’s more-critical-than-descriptive version of the conceptual analysis of social practices. Under this approach, determining the concept we currently have is distinguished from correcting the concept to make it match better the practice with which it corresponds, and from offering an improved concept, the correction corresponding to the normative value(s) the practice is meant to further. Under this “conceptual pluralism,” Stoljar argues that moral analysis, as part of developing a better concept, is often (though not always) called for, including in the case of our concept of law. We ultimately must focus, she argues, on “what kind of thing we want law to be.”

Keith Culver and Michael Giudice examine the challenge legal pluralism raises to conventional analytical legal philosophy. As they report, one standard response to the challenge is to claim that conventional analytical theories that attempt to determine the nature of law while focusing on municipal legal systems are simply theories with different subjects and theories that answer different questions than do legal pluralist theories that focus on the variety of (state and non-state) forms of governance. Culver and Giudice challenge this response, arguing that legal pluralist theories in fact show basic weaknesses in conventional state-law-focused theories, in particular the way that the works of theorists like Austin, Kelsen, Hart, and Raz have trouble explaining the continuity of legal systems and the relationship generally of law and state.

Andrea Dolcetti and Giovanni Battista Ratti evaluate a famous challenge Dworkin raised against legal positivism. He had argued that legal positivism (or at least those forms of legal positivism based on Hart’s theory) assumed general agreement among legal officials regarding the law. Dworkin, however, claimed that the experience of the English and American legal systems, and likely most other legal systems, has been one of pervasive and deep disagreement among legal officials, involving the type and extent of disagreements that are not compatible with Hart’s Rule of Recognition. Dolcetti and Ratti offer a careful analysis of the nature of disagreement in (most) legal systems, and conclude that it generally involves an underlying agreement on the set of valid sources of law, combined with disagreement in the interpretation of those sources. The interpretative disagreements, they add, themselves often involve an underlying agreement on the canons or methods of interpretation, but disagreement on their priority or on their proper application to particular cases. In summary, Dolcetti and Ratti argue that, contra Dworkin, Hart’s legal theory does have the resources to account for the disagreements that occur in legal systems.

There are many other worthy and important contributions in this collection, but there is time here for only the briefest overview: Matthew H. Kramer argues that Scott Shapiro’s criticisms (in his book, Legality, and in other publications) of Hart’s legal theory are undermined by a more careful reading of Hart’s works; Kenneth M. Ehrenberg suggests a modification of Raz’s understanding of law’s authority and law’s claims; Imer B. Flores outlines an ambitious approach to law and legal reasoning that would incorporate morality, logic, and policy objectives; Bruno Celano explores the moral value of the Rule of Law, emphasizing how consistency and “compliability” respect the dignity of individuals by treating them as “centers of deliberation”; David Enoch and Kevin Toh suggest that a “thick concept” analysis of legal statements might explain the way that legal propositions seem to be simultaneously descriptive and normative, and they argue that many ideas from recent legal theory could be understood as approaching, however imperfectly, this “thick concept” understanding; and Dan Priel argues that theories about the nature of law reflect underlying political cultures, and uses the different political cultures of the United States and Britain, especially regarding the relationship of law and politics, to explain why the theories of (the American) Dworkin and (the British) Hart look so different, and why the search for a single nature of law is misguided.

Overall, what may be gathered from this volume is a sense of the current state of analytical legal philosophy, as the collection samples works from some of the best theorists now writing in this area, both established names and up-and-coming younger scholars. In sharp contrast with critics’ accusations that analytical legal theory today consists only of dry scholastic debates over trivial claims and distinctions, this volume displays lively, wide-ranging, and sophisticated arguments. There is every reason to be impressed with the present, and the future, of this approach to legal theory.