Philosophical History and the Problem of Consciousness

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Paul Livingston , Philosophical History and the Problem of Consciousness, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 294pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521838207.

Reviewed by Anne Jaap Jacobson, University of Houston


In a recent London Review of Books (10/21/04), Jerry Fodor remarks that few outside the profession find current analytic philosophy, in contrast to continental philosophy, at all attractive. The latter is harder to read and requires lots more background, but its popularity seems vastly higher than that of analytic philosophy. Fodor thinks this lack of appeal may be due to our extensive concern with possible worlds and modal ambiguities. But, equally, few lay persons are interested in the fairly prevalent claims that there are really no qualia or that, for example, pain is a myth. Many think that these claims are obviously all wrong, and that they show philosophy is rightly regarded as intellectually impoverished. Consciousness and its penalties are, after all, at the heart of our self-conception, as Livingston stresses in Philosophical History and the Problem of Consciousness (PHPC).

Analytic philosophy's problems are problems with language. Is there a deep sense in which analytic philosophy's treatment of consciousness involves a serious misconstruction of language? Wittgenstein argued for the view that philosophy's failures in general are often attributable to mistakes about language, broadly construed, and he was preceded in this view by Moore and followed by others, including Ryle and Austin.

While Wittgenstein's approach in works after the Tractatus was typically to focus on specific issues, PHPC looks for a very general problem to explain what may be current analytic philosophy of mind's genuinely world-class failure, the failure to "explain consciousness," as Livingston puts it.

The diagnosis offered is that analytic philosophy has a conception of meaning and explanation which it mistakenly regards as universally correct. The conception is what Livingston terms the "structuralist conception." A central task of the book is to articulate this conception and to trace the development that has placed it so deeply in the minds of analytic philosophers that it is hard for anyone to discern an alternative. Livingston's work combines the history of analytic philosophy with concerns and discussions heavily influenced by a continental sympathy. This sort of synthesis, foreign as it may now seem, is potentially a rich source of interesting ideas. It may also, less fortunately, lead to the sentences of a sort analytic philosophers are often taught -- not always successfully -- to avoid. One may come to feel that PHPC has too many sentences with sixty or more words.

Does Livingston's project succeed? Some of the most impressive parts of the book are the historically based descriptions and diagnosis of contemporary structuralism, the theory of meaning and explanation that causes the apparent failure of philosophy. Livingston somewhat contentiously begins with the Vienna Circle, whose concerns with mind and knowledge he captures as a prolonged and engaging dialectic. This is contentious because one may also see in Anglo-American philosophy of mind very distinctive Humean approaches to the sort of causal analyses Livingston discuss; equally, others have found functionalism, another concern of Livingston's, in Aristotle. Nonetheless, the scope of the study is large and includes, among many others, Carnap, Neurath, Smart, Fodor and Chalmers. They are seen as working to elaborate and refine a preoccupation with structure that overall subverts the goal of explaining conscious experience.

In Livingston's story, structuralism becomes an increasingly formal demand on theory. "A structural or structuralist explanation is one that accounts for particular items by locating them in a broader structure of relations of one kind or another" (3). Structuralists operate with a conception of structured explanation; particular explanations are instances of this structure. Meaning or understanding is elucidated or achieved by generating such explanations. The trap it poses will vary with different types of structures, but the general problem can be illustrated with an example: For physicalists the distinctive structure will be the structure of explanations suitable for objective phenomena such as the sciences treat; but arguably many features of subjective experience -- its immediacy and directness, for example (9) -- will not be explained in such structures. Hence, consciousness arguably must be irremediably problematized by physicalism.

The news about the analytic tradition is not entirely negative, and some of Livingston's most interesting ideas come as delineations of what we can learn from the tradition, and what can be learned from "the method of analytic reflection." Some of the lessons he takes himself to have learned will not be accepted by all in the tradition. For example, the idea that all objective empirical claims are "responsive and responsible" to claims about "our own" conscious experience is a very familiar thought but also both an unclear and a contestable thesis. Similarly, the idea that there are phenomenological laws which are not best thought of as completely factual is based on the Husserl's problematic view that empirical investigations cannot yield knowledge of essences. Nonetheless, philosophers of mind should be concerned with questions about whether experience has a discoverable law-governed structure, and, accordingly, Livingston manages at the very least to raise important questions about the nature of the philosophical project so many take themselves to be engaged upon.

What serious questions about the main thesis of the book might one have? Livingston continuously ascribes to analytic philosophers a theory of meaning that seems to be almost entirely formal; meaning is revealed by logical structure. It is true that even the stress on logical structure is seen as allowing for relations among concepts, and so the theory of meaning is not entirely formal. However, there are very large areas of discussion in philosophy of mind that Livingston does not directly address. He leaves the reader in effect having to interpret all the standardly expressed concerns about ontology and causal closure into his diagnostic schema about structuralism. At many points, arguments that I had learned from, e.g., my old tutor Gilbert Ryle (a significant figure in the book) as fundamentally motivated by ontology turn out to be, in Livingston's hands, based on apparently very different concerns about logical form. The non-analytic reader may be well prepared to believe that a preoccupation with logical form is at the heart of analytic philosophy of mind's problems with consciousness, but to an analytic reader it may well seem far from clearly true. Hence, even Livingston's historical reading provides interpretations which are not obviously at the very heart of the matter.

Reviews are done in a short period of time and that makes it hard to do justice to an original approach to an area in need of outside energy. And analytic philosophers may well have a mistaken tendency to read ontology off of logical form, even if this is not quite the same thing as embracing a structuralist theory of meaning. Hence, I will look forward to working through the book more slowly with students. There is a lot in it that we should be thinking about.