Philosophical Inquiries into Pregnancy, Childbirth, and Mothering: Maternal Subjects

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Sheila Lintott and Maureen Sander-Staudt (eds.), Philosophical Inquiries into Pregnancy, Childbirth, and Mothering: Maternal Subjects, Routledge, 2012, 267pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415891875.

Reviewed by Shelley M. Park, University of Central Florida


Lintott and Sander-Staudt's anthology explores -- as its subtitle suggests -- a range of "maternal subjects." The most prominent of these include pregnancy, birthing, lactation, and postpartum; less prominent but nonetheless important topics include adoption, stepmothering, and disability. These topics are approached largely, but not exclusively, by foregrounding the subjective experiences of mothers as well as the cultural norms and public policies to which mothers are subjected. As the editors indicate in their introduction to the volume, the subjective perspectives of mothers are frequently rendered invisible in philosophy; thus the book seeks "to make maternal subjects, in the many senses of that word, the central focus of philosophical inquiry" (2).

As the title suggests, the essays collected here take a philosophical approach to these topics, drawing on the work of feminist philosophers such as Sara Ruddick (to whom the volume is dedicated), Adrienne Rich, Simone de Beauvoir, Luce Irigaray, Julia Kristeva, Iris Marion Young, Eve Feder Kittay, Rebecca Kukla, Maria Lugones and many others, as well as that of canonical male philosophers such as Plato, Kant, Emmanuel Levinas, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty. Care ethics takes center stage in several essays, as do theories of embodiment and standpoint epistemology. Lintott and Sander-Staudts "main claim" is that "pregnancy, childbirth, and motherhood yield subjective and embodied standpoints from which to consider a wide array of philosophical areas and topics," including metaphysical, epistemological, ethical, aesthetic, and political concerns (7).

The subjective and embodied standpoints that the volume most widely presents are those of straight, biological, middle-class, able-bodied, white, western mothers of infants and very young children. Two-thirds of the essays focus explicitly on philosophical insights gleaned from pregnancy, childbirth and the early months or years of mothering. As a mother of young adults who has inhabited complex and shifting relationships of kinship including open adoption, the divorce-extended family, joint-custody, and same-sex parenting, I yearned for greater philosophical reflection on the personally and philosophically transformative experiences of non-normative maternal subjects in the collection. That said, a single volume cannot cover everything and the editors are careful to note that "the subjective expressions in this collection are not meant to represent all women's experiences" (5). Although its focus is limited, the volume does successfully indicate a variety of ways in which the maternal subjects that are considered might yield important philosophical insights.

The anthology is divided into three parts. Part I, "Maternal Norms, Practices, and Insights," offers critical reflections on some specific maternal norms and practices. Jean Keller explores the goals of maternal practice, such as Ruddick's "preservative love," through the lens of transracial adoption, with specific emphasis on maternal strategies for "kinning" (helping a child develop a sense of belonging in her adoptive family) and the development of racial-ethnic identity in children of color adopted by white parents (helping a child develop a sense of belonging within her own racial-ethnic community). Jennifer Benson and Allison Wolf focus on the invisibility of the needs and experiences of postpartum mothers in lay literature on pregnancy and childbirth. In a nicely paired set of essays, "Into the Mouths of Babes" and "Tales from the Tit," co-authors Christine Overall and Tabitha Bernard argue that there is a moral (albeit defeasible) responsibility to breastfeed, whereas Lissa Skitolsky argues that the maternal pain associated with breastfeeding is "useless suffering" insofar as the benefits to children of breastfeeding may be achieved in other ways. Part I concludes with a delightful and insightful set of reflections by Sherri Irvin on the phenomenon of maternal disgust.

Part II, "Maternal Roles and Relations," opens with two essays focusing on disability. Maeve O'Donovan explores the specific challenges faced by mothers with (cognitive as well as physical) disabilities, suggesting that disabled mothers provide an epistemologically valuable standpoint from which to view motherhood; Christine James highlights the challenges of mothering children with disabilities, arguing for impatience as a moral virtue. Following this, two essays by Alison Stone ("Psychoanalytic Feminism and the Dynamics of Mothering a Daughter") and Joshua Shaw ("Why Don't Philosophers Tell Their Mothers' Stories?") serve to highlight the distinctions between mother-daughter and mother-son relationships. Stone argues for mother-daughter relationships as a source of distinctive and transformative value for mothers, while Shaw reflects on the challenges for a male philosopher of learning to listen to his mother's stories. Beckey Sukovaty closes this section with her essay on stepmothers as "hybrid beings" who are uniquely positioned to respond to a child's need for both distance and closeness and thus provide a model for a responsible maternal ethic.

Part III, "Maternal Phenomena, Phenomenology, and Aesthetics," shifts our focus to phenomenological and aesthetic reflections deriving from the experiences of pregnancy and childbirth. Brooke Schueneman highlights the ways in which pregnancy and birthgiving give rise to contemplative practices, not unlike the contemplations of Stoics, which prepare us for death. Julie Piering highlights the ways in which pregnant bodies are presumed to belong to the community with both positive consequences (e.g., increased care, attention and status) and negative consequences (e.g., increased surveillance and coercion) for pregnant women. In "Becoming Bovine," Sally Fischer explores the ways in which pregnancy and postpartum motherhood allow us to experience ourselves as mammals (rather than abstract "thinking things") and illuminate the need for gender-sensitive legislation that promotes co-parenting through equal treatment policies of paid leave for caregivers while simultaneously recognizing the need for specific maternal (not parental) rights rooted in biological difference.

Co-authors Peg Brand and Paula Granger highlight the absence of images of childbirth in contemporary (western) art, arguing that representations of birthing women, like pregnant, birthing, and lactating bodies themselves, are subjected to male scrutiny, monitoring, and control. The final essay, by Sheila Lintott, explores the ways in which the experiences of gestation and birthgiving may give rise to a distinctly feminist conception of the sublime, less reliant on a subject-object and mind-body split than traditional philosophical conceptions of sublimity. This concluding essay returns us to the first essay of Part III in its reflections on the potential death of the subject involved in birthgiving while also returning us to the overarching theme of the volume, namely the ways in which maternal subjects may transform philosophical inquiry.

The organization of the volume seems somewhat strained, showing the signs (as, in fairness, many anthologies do) of attempting to "fit" a diverse selection of essays together into groupings that do not always neatly cohere. The rather broad categories into which the volume is partitioned -- maternal norms, maternal relations, and maternal phenomena -- seep into each other. Clearly, the essays in Part I are not the only ones in the volume that illuminate norms of motherhood or offer maternal insights on such norms. For example, the essays on mothers with disabilities (O'Donovan) and stepmothers (Sukovaty) included in Part II, as well as Piering's Part III reflections on the public coercions to which pregnant women are frequently subjected, vividly highlight the social norms giving rise to stereotypes of "good" and "bad" mothers. Nor are the essays grouped in Part II the only essays here that speak to maternal roles or relations. For example, Keller's Part I essay -- highlighting the unique role of transracially adoptive mothers in helping their children belong -- bears some similarities to (as well as differences from) reflections on other types of non-normative families found in Part II, such as those involving ability differences between mothers and children (O'Donovan and James) or those resulting from divorce and remarriage (Sukovaty). It would be fruitful to place these essays closer together, prompting Keller's reflections on "kinning" to bear on the challenges for stepmothers, or James' reflections on impatience as a moral virtue to bear on the public anti-racist work that is a part of parenting a child of color. Likewise, Irvin's essay on the phenomenology of maternal disgust could have been as fruitfully placed in Part III alongside other essays on phenomenology and aesthetics, as in Part I on maternal norms.

As these organizational musings suggest, it is difficult for a feminist philosophy text to use standard categorical tools. For decades, feminist philosophers have been deconstructing the subdivisions of philosophy into traditional categories of epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, politics, and aesthetics; a close examination of pregnancy, childbirth, and mothering such as this volume offers demonstrates further the inseparability of these philosophical pursuits by illustrating how the physical embodiments of mothers give rise to situated epistemologies inseparable from ethical, political, and aesthetic insights (which are themselves largely inseparable from one another).

Some of the strongest essays in the collection travel with ease across divergent, but intersecting philosophical terrain. Among the "must reads", I would include the contributions by Skitolsky, Irvin, and Shaw. Skitolsky's "Tales from the Tit: The Moral and Political Implications of Useless Lactational Suffering" is a welcome antidote to much of the lay and professional (including philosophical) literature on the ethics of breastfeeding, which largely focuses on the beneficial consequences of breastfeeding for mothers and especially children. Pointing out that lactation is painful for many women, Skitolsky deftly shifts our attention from the moral responsibility of mothers to our collective moral responsibility to mothers. Adopting Levinas's phrase "useless suffering" to "designate a type of harm that is neither chosen nor deserved and that forms the basis of our ethical obligation to the other" (64), Skitolsky prompts us to simultaneously recognize maternal suffering as part of the lactating mother's phenomenological and ethical landscape and to recognize the uselessness of such suffering by challenging an "exclusive" model of motherhood rooted in the politics of individualism.

Central to her claim that lactating mothers experience useless suffering is Skitolsky's claim that the benefits of breastfeeding may be achieved through a "revolutionary politics of cross-nursing" (69) and the (re)establishment of milk banks that would make breast milk readily available through means that (like blood banks) assure its safety, while also compensating lactating women for their labor (75). The (false) dilemma that asks us to choose either the suffering of women or the well-being of children, Skitolsky aptly points out, emerges from the (heterosexist and classist) assumption that mothering must be an exclusive activity, rather than a shared or communal activity. Notably, this is one of the only essays in this volume to consider mothering as a communal activity. This is somewhat surprising given the well-known work of sociologist Patricia Hill Collins on "othermothering" in racial-ethnic communities and perhaps betrays the disciplinary insularity of philosophical work on motherhood, as well as the potential racial and class biases of a profession that remains dominated by white folk.

In her "Motherhood and the Workings of Disgust," Irvin works at the intersections of phenomenology, aesthetics, ethics, and politics to explore two interrelated aspects of disgust as they relate to motherhood, namely mothers' affective reactions to the rather disgusting things their children do (eating rotting food off the ground, vomiting, shitting, and rubbing their snot around) and the ways in which others enforce social norms of "good" or "civilized" mothering through looks of disgust cast toward "unruly" mothers. Central to Irvin's autobiographical reflections (which will resonate with anyone who has cared for young children) is the claim that "the workings of disgust" illuminate "a mechanism through which the oppression of women [as the presumed primary caretakers of children] is maintained" (80).

On the one hand, mothers should (and often do) relax their sense of disgust in accepting their child's behaviors and bodily functions as healthy and natural. In so doing, a mother allows her child to explore the world, enhances emotional intimacy by embracing her child "without reluctance or hesitation," and enhances maternal knowledge by a sensory familiarity with a child's bodily excretions (81). On the other hand, such relaxation of our own disgust makes us subject to the disgust of others who view our dirty, unkempt, or ground-feeding children as a sign of our own failure as mothers. Thus, mothers frequently experience shame even as their own disgust response diminishes. Irvin concludes thus, that "the inner work of mothering is to replace feelings of shame with a lighthearted contempt for the societal demands that would demand it, and for the mechanisms of disgust by which those norms are enforced. The outer work, surely, is to dismantle them" (87). Irvin's essay points us toward the importance for philosophy of the relatively new but burgeoning interdisciplinary field of affect studies. It also illustrates the philosophical import of autobiographical narrative and critical self-reflection on maternal subjects.

Shaw's contribution to the volume, "Why Don't Philosophers Tell Their Mothers' Stories?" also engages in autobiographical self-reflection in seeking to understand why philosophers -- himself included -- frequently share their father's stories, but not those of their mothers -- even when "their arguments demand it" (139). Shaw resists stopping at the seemingly obvious answer, namely that the absence of motherhood in philosophy reveals the male-dominated nature of the profession and its exclusion of women, noting that philosophers routinely engage in thought experiments about what it "is like" to be the "other" (e.g., a bat, a brain in a vat). Why then do philosophers have so "little imaginative curiosity about women's experiences"? (141).

Candidly confessing that in his own work he repeatedly drew on his father's life to make sense of Levinas's ideas, despite Levinas's own self-criticism for focusing on fatherhood to the exclusion of motherhood, Shaw suggests that in their routine thought experiments male philosophers explicitly imagine what is unfamiliar while covertly imagining qualities that are "comfortingly familiar" such as independence, autonomy, and disembodiment, rather than relationships of dependence -- such as pregnancy -- that are profoundly embodied. Setting out to remedy this, Shaw attempts to interview his mother about her experiences with pregnancy. During his own wife's pregnancy, however, he learns the limitations of this approach as itself "forced and overly cerebral" (148). Reflecting upon the more fluid conversations he overhears between his wife, mother, and sister about becoming a mother, Shaw suggests that there is a gendered social dimension to conversations about motherhood, concluding that it is "not enough" to advise philosophers to listen to their mothers' stories; what is also needed is reflection on the gendered contexts (e.g., nursing classes, Lamaze classes) in which women tell their stories and how men might learn from them.

Philosophical Inquiries into Pregnancy, Childbirth, and Mothering provides one such gendered context from which we, as philosophers, may learn about becoming a mother by eavesdropping on mothers' stories. While some of the essays included here are, like Shaw's attempt to interview his mother, overly cerebral and the organization of the essays seems somewhat forced, as a collection it provides us with dialogical conversations among feminist philosophers on and as maternal subjects that provoke new insights into both motherhood and philosophy itself. What remains needed is further reflection on the racialized, classed, and heterosexist contexts in which women philosophers tell their maternal stories and how we all might learn from this.