Philosophical Knowledge: Its Possibility and Scope

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Christian Beyer and Alex Burri (eds.), Philosophical Knowledge: Its Possibility and Scope, Rodopi, 2007, 305pp., $85.00 (pbk), ISBN 9789042022348.

Reviewed by Duncan Pritchard, University of Edinburgh


From time to time, analytical philosophy enters an introspective phase in which it starts to ask fundamental metaphilosophical questions about the nature and scope of the analytical project itself. I think it is fair to say that we are in the midst of just such a phase right now. Think, for example, of the current debates about experimental philosophy, or about the role of linguistic data in philosophical arguments (e.g., in discussions of epistemological contextualism), or about the status of thought experiments (e.g., in metaphysics), and so on. In each case the issue is at least implicitly the metaphilosophical concern of what the appropriate methodology of analytical philosophy should be. Moreover, while issues like this are always discussed by philosophers, the particularly widespread and inter-connected treatment of these issues in the contemporary debate signals a deeper metaphilosophical concern.

This is not the place to enter into a discussion of why we are entering such a phase right now, since this would take us too far afield for our purposes here. I mention it only to make clear from the outset how timely this volume is. For while the title of the volume is directed at the specific issue of the status of philosophical knowledge, it is clear that the overarching theme of the book is to tie together the various metaphilosophical issues that characterise the introspective phase just described.

For example, the book opens with an exchange between Alvin Goldman ('Philosophical Intuitions: Their Target, Their Source, and Their Epistemic Status') and Hilary Kornblith ('Naturalism and Intuitions') on the role of intuitions in philosophy. As is now familiar to those who have been following this debate, Goldman offers a naturalistic defence of the philosophical use of intuitions, while Kornblith demurs, claiming that we should adopt the methodology of the empirical sciences instead.

The concern with the status of philosophical intuitions is then taken up in the next two papers in the volume. The first is by Ernest Sosa ('Intuitions: Their Nature and Their Epistemic Efficacy'), who essentially offers an overview of his position and a defence of it in the light of some objections put to him by Thomas Grundmann. It is appropriate, then, that Sosa's paper should be followed by a piece by Grundmann himself ('The Nature of Rational Intuitions and a Fresh Look at the Explanationist Objection'), in which he develops his own view on the subject.

These pieces on intuitions are followed by Timothy Williamson's paper ('Philosophical Knowledge and Knowledge of Counterfactuals') on the epistemology of metaphysical modality. Williamson argues that we do not need a dedicated faculty of intuition in order to offer such an epistemology, on the grounds that "it is simply a special case of the epistemology of counterfactual thinking" (p. 120). He concludes that "[H]ere, as elsewhere, we can do philosophy on the basis of general cognitive capacities that are in no deep way philosophical." (ibid.) The import of such a claim to the metaphilosophical issues raised at the start of this review is fairly transparent.

Williamson's paper is followed by Quassim Cassam's contribution ('The Possibility of Knowledge') in which he describes his innovative way of understanding sceptical problems in terms of what he calls 'how-possible' questions. Cassam's clever idea -- explored more fully in his excellent book, The Possibility of Knowledge -- is that construing these problems in this way enables one to delineate three increasingly demanding levels of response to sceptical questions. A satisfactory treatment of the sceptical problem, Cassam argues, must respond to that problem at all three levels.

Cassam's proposal has negative implications for transcendental arguments. This scepticism about the effectiveness of such arguments is shared by Robert Stern in his paper ('Transcendental Arguments: A Plea for Modesty') that follows Cassam's. What is interesting about Stern's paper is that he rejects an influential critical line offered by Barry Stroud on this score, but argues that nonetheless we should still understand transcendental arguments as motivating relatively modest philosophical conclusions.

Alex Burri's paper ('A Priori Existence') doesn't quite engage with the metaphilosophical theme of the volume to the extent of the papers just noted, but it is at least relevant to the more general question of the scope of philosophical knowledge. His concern is to explore whether existence claims can be defended in an a priori fashion (Burri holds that they can). The more specifically metaphilosophical concerns resurface in Elke Brendel's contribution ('Self-Referential Arguments in Philosophy') in which she examines the status of self-referential arguments -- e.g., the Liar Paradox -- which clearly play a fundamental role in philosophical analysis, but whose philosophical import, argues Brendel, is moot. Michael Esfield's contribution ('Metaphysics of Science Between Metaphysics and Science') also re-engages with more metaphilosophical concerns: he argues for the provocative thesis that metaphysics depends upon science when it comes to the real constitution of the world.

The paper in the volume that will most connect with our current introspective phase in philosophy is clearly Hans-Johann Glock's paper ('Could Anything Be Wrong With Analytical Philosophy?') in which he argues for a certain conception of what constitutes analytical philosophy. Along the way he points out that on certain other conceptions of what constitutes analytical philosophy it is a priori true that it couldn't be in crisis, which is clearly an unwelcome consequence of the characterisation.

Like Burri's paper, Frank Jackson's contribution ('On Not Forgetting the Epistemology of Names') is more concerned with the specific issue of philosophical knowledge rather than more general metaphilosophical questions. His focus in this paper is to defend (a version of) the description theory of reference for proper names. In particular, he argues that any philosophical theory in this regard must attend to the epistemological and representational roles of proper names.

One of the most interesting papers in the volume is Marcus Willaschek's paper ('Contextualism About Knowledge and Justification by Default') in which he critiques the attributer contextualist account of knowledge -- more precisely, of 'knows' -- and argues instead for a 'default and challenge' account of justification of the sort defended by Robert Brandom and Michael Williams.

Like several of the papers in this volume, Dagfinn Føllesdal's paper ('Existence, Inexpressibility and Philosophical Knowledge') is directed at the issue of the status of philosophical knowledge, but what is significant about this contribution is the broad historical sweep that it offers. Føllesdal's overarching concern is with the various philosophical treatments of ontology -- from Carnap and Wittgenstein through to Quine -- and to register Husserl's distinctive contribution to this issue: his notion of the thetic component of acts. This element of Husserl's work was unknown to me, and I found this discussion fascinating.

The final paper in the volume, by Christian Beyer ('Contextualism and the Background of (Philosophical) Justification'), returns to the issue of attributer contextualism raised in Willaschek's paper. Unlike Willaschek's piece, Beyer's discussion of this view is highly sympathetic. Indeed, he thinks that such a proposal, at least when adapted in the light of some remarks by Wittgenstein and Husserl on the 'background' which informs epistemic standing, can help us get a better grip on what philosophical knowledge involves, and the related issue of the epistemic status of intuitions.

Clearly it would be impossible for me to offer, within the scope of a mere book review, a thorough critical discussion of each of the papers collected here, and so I won't even attempt to. Instead, I will focus on a couple of the papers that most interested me. Before I do so, however, let me register a couple of quibbles that I have with the volume.

The first quibble is that it is, I think, a missed opportunity that the editors of the volume have not provided an introduction which sets out the aims of the volume and how the papers collected here speak to those aims. Instead, we get merely a very short preface.

This brings me to my second quibble, which is that it isn't altogether obvious that all of the papers in the volume belong there. There are actually quite a few papers where the connection with the theme of the volume is at best tenuous, but there is also one paper -- the piece by Willaschek -- in which there simply seems to be no connection at all, not even a tenuous one. After all, while attributer contextualism certainly does raise some interesting metaphilosophical (and metaepistemological) issues, these are not the concern of this paper. Instead, this is simply a paper (albeit a very good paper) on a central recent epistemological topic. Why is it in this volume? I'm not sure. An introduction would have explained the matter, but the short preface does not, simply stating, without explanation, that Willaschek's piece -- like those by Brendel, Esfeld, Glock and Jackson -- is concerned with "analytical philosophy and its methods". But it isn't.

These are, however, very minor quibbles, since this is a great volume. All the papers are of the highest quality, and some of them (such as Willaschek's) are very good indeed. With that caveat in mind, let me raise a few issues with a couple of the papers, starting (surprise, surprise) with Willaschek's paper.

As noted above, Willaschek's concern is to motivate a version of the default-and-challenge account of epistemic justification defended by Brandom and Williams in contrast to the sort of attributer contextualism defended by, amongst others, David Lewis, Stewart Cohen and Keith DeRose. In particular, Willaschek argues that such a proposal offers a more compelling response to the problem of radical scepticism. There is much to admire in Willaschek's paper. He offers, for example, a compelling critique of attributer contextualism and an enlightening account of how one can develop the default-and-challenge model of epistemic justification. Nevertheless, his response to the problem of scepticism never hits the mark.

What is central to the default-and-challenge model -- at least for our purposes here -- is that it aims to restrict the extent to which challenges can undermine epistemic justification. More specifically, the guiding idea is that one has (at least modulo some qualifications which we will set to one side) a 'default' epistemic standing for one's beliefs in the absence of an appropriate challenge to that belief, where what counts as an appropriate challenge is, while sensitive to contextual factors, severely limited. In particular, the mere raising of a challenge does not suffice to undermine the epistemic standing for one's belief.

Let's suppose that we grant that this account of epistemic justification is sound. The issue is what the import of this account is to the sceptical problem. If the problem of radical scepticism rested on the existence of a sceptical adversary, someone who is actually advocating the sceptical problem, then its import would be clear, since such a philosopher would simply be unable to get his or her negative epistemic project off the ground by the lights of this proposal. The trouble is, however, that the sceptical problem does not in any way rest on the existence of a sceptical adversary. It is, instead, a paradox, at least when it is formulated in its strongest form.

In the contemporary literature, it is Barry Stroud who, I think, has made this point clearest. One of the guiding themes of his seminal book, The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism, is how the sceptical problem falls out of "platitudes" that we would all otherwise accept, and hence is a paradox. That is, Stroud argues that there are a series of straightforward claims about knowledge which we find highly intuitive when taken individually but which, when taken collectively, entail the intellectually inadmissible sceptical conclusion. There are some complexities here, but the standard way of putting this point in the recent literature will suffice for our purposes. This approach treats the sceptical problem as resting on simply two highly intuitive premises. The first states that we are unable to know that sceptical hypotheses -- e.g., that one is a brain-in-a-vat being 'fed' one's experiences by supercomputers -- are false. The second is simply the closure principle -- roughly, that if one knows one proposition, and one knows that it entails a second proposition, then one also knows that second proposition. Put the two together and it logically follows that one does not know the 'everyday' propositions (e.g., that one has two hands) which are (known to be) inconsistent with sceptical hypotheses.

How does the default-and-challenge model respond to scepticism of this sort? In short, it doesn't. After all, this paradox, like philosophical paradoxes more generally, merely reflects a tension within our own concepts, and so in no way rests on there being anyone who proposes the paradox. More generally, Willaschek, in his otherwise subtle and penetrating paper, never considers this contemporary rendering of the sceptical problem and the particular worry that it poses for his view. This is especially surprising once one remembers that Williams himself is very sensitive to the difference between a Cartesian-style scepticism which has a paradoxical structure and a Pyrrhonian-style scepticism which rests on the existence of an embodied sceptic advocating a sceptical stance. In particular, Williams doesn't hold that a response to Pyrrhonian-style scepticism is thereby a response to Cartesian-style scepticism, which is why he offers separate anti-sceptical responses to each form of scepticism (as regards Cartesian-style scepticism, see, in particular, his book Unnatural Doubts).

A misunderstanding of what generates the radical sceptical problem also infects Stern's contribution to the volume. Like Willaschek, he fails to understand that scepticism is a paradox (relatedly, he doesn't state what the sceptical argument is). As a result, his discussion is guided by the thought that the sceptic is an embodied adversary that we must intellectually 'help' in some way. Consider the following passage:

It is implausible to think that the sceptic would be satisfied with the use of any transcendental argument against him, given what has driven him to be a sceptic in the first place. We must either prevent him being driven to scepticism at some earlier point, in which case an appeal to transcendental arguments will be unnecessary; or we must accept that we cannot so prevent this, but by then a transcendental argument will come too late. (p. 148)

The fiction that the sceptic is an embodied adversary is harmless, of course, just so long as one remembers that it is a fiction. But Stern forgets this crucial fact, for it is central to his response to the sceptic (as this passage indicates) to conceive of the sceptical challenge as represented by a real live sceptic whom we need to respond to.

More generally, Stern misunderstands the sceptical problem by supposing that it is essentially wedded to an infallibilist conception of epistemic standing. But the sceptical paradox we stated above makes no such appeal to infallibilism. These two criticisms -- that Stern treats the sceptic as an adversary and also committed to infallibilism -- come together once one considers how Stern tries to undermine the sceptic by arguing that his view allows that "the lack of evidence for the sceptical scenario is sufficient to justify us in accepting our ordinary empirical beliefs for the usual reasons" (p. 158). While this strategy might work against either an embodied sceptic (who would need to justify raising the sceptical scenario in the first place) or a form of scepticism which was committed to infallibilism, it has no impact at all against the contemporary form of scepticism described above.

Still, Stern's paper is an excellent contribution to the literature on this topic, and that I have chosen to pick on this particular piece from the volume should not detract from this. This is an excellent collection of papers, on an important and timely topic in contemporary philosophy, and it is highly recommended.