Philosophical Legacies: Essays on the Thought of Kant, Hegel, and Their Contemporaries

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Daniel O. Dahlstrom, Philosophical Legacies: Essays on the Thought of Kant, Hegel, and Their Contemporaries, Catholic University of America Press, 2008, 267pp., $64.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813215211.

Reviewed by James R. Walker, Union College


a legacy occupies a nether region, defined by neither the sheer presence nor the sheer absence of the authority in question. Different from past and present, it can neither be defined in terms of past or present alone nor be defined without them. Something comparable applies to efforts to determine a legacy, attempts to relate the present -- itself a moving target -- to a past that is untouchable. (p. 228)

§1. Introductory Remarks

Philosophical Legacies is a collection of essays by Daniel Dahlstrom focusing on the legacies of Kant, Hegel, and some of the more important, yet less heralded, figures serving to connect, and also extend, the thought of these two canonical titans. Indeed, Dahlstrom's insightful treatment of these less heralded figures alone would serve to recommend this collection, especially his treatments of F. H. Jacobi, J. G. Hamann, J. G. Herder, and Friedrich Schiller. Dahlstrom does a fine job of demonstrating that a full comprehension of the philosophical systems of Kant and Hegel requires an appreciation of the contributions made by these less heralded figures whose polemics and own positive philosophical theories serve to not only connect, but also lay the hermeneutical context for their more heralded idealist contemporaries. Dahlstrom also makes some fine, more direct, contributions to the scholarship on Kant and Hegel. Dahlstrom balances presenting overarching systematic notions and issues fundamental to their entire philosophical thought (e.g., essays one, seven, ten, and fifteen), and also focusing in on some of the finer details constituting those systems (e.g., see essays two and three on Kant, and essays eight, nine, and eleven on Hegel). Indeed, as I will comment more on below, his treatment of Hegel's concern with the problem of the objectivity of thought in the seventh essay is quite insightful and serves to correct many a common error interpreters have made on this extremely thorny issue. Quite simply put, with this collection Dahlstrom has provided a must-read for anyone truly interested in understanding the extremely rich and fertile philosophical period in German philosophy that begins with Kant and runs through Hegel.

Yet there is much more to Dahlstrom's work then pure historical exegesis. He not only presents a faithful historical rendering of the thought of those figures he deals with, but he does so in a manner that forces the reader into philosophical engagement with those historical figures. As Dahlstrom indicates in the above quote, the very attempt to determine a philosophical legacy requires one to bring one's own contemporary philosophical concerns and notions to the exegetical table. This allows us, as contemporary philosophers, to engage the historical figure in philosophical dialogue on those very issues that matter most to us as philosophers. Here historical scholarship meets an active pursuit of philosophical insight, and Dahlstrom masterfully balances the two without succumbing to anachronism.

It is in the spirit of such critical engagement that I wish to comment on Dahlstrom's work. In what follows I will attempt to unravel an alternative theme that can be plumbed from looking at the legacy of this extremely rich and fertile period in the history of Western thought. In doing so I do not so much reject any element of Dahlstrom's interpretation. Rather I wish to cast certain elements and figures within in it in a different light. In other words, I will present what I take to be a central element of that legacy bequeathed to us by the central figures in this tradition that Dahlstrom fails to emphasize. In particular, I will look at the fundamental concern with the objectivity of normative schemes that lies at the very basis of Hegel's scientific system of philosophy and suggest a reading of Hegel that draws out a fundamentally pragmatic approach to dealing with this issue. Thus, I will take as my point of departure that at which Dahlstrom concludes his fine historical study: the legacy of Hegel.

§2. Dahlstrom's Interpretation of Hegel's Legacy

In the final essay of the collection Dahlstrom turns to a consideration of the Hegelian legacy. His ultimate concern is to address, in connection with similar concerns in Derrida, the rather oblique issue of the extent to which that legacy can even be thrown into question given the positive role Hegel assigns to the notion of negation in his own thought. Indeed, Dahlstrom concludes that "the questionability of putting Hegel's discourse in question remains its legacy" (p. 242). My more limited concern is an evaluation of Dahlstrom's more basic presentation of the core elements constituting Hegel's philosophical legacy (that legacy which we are then to concern ourselves with the questionability of). In dealing with this issue, I, like Dahlstrom, will limit myself to this legacy as it relates to certain methodological and overarching systematic elements in Hegel's thought.

Dahlstrom identifies four fundamental legacies in Hegel's conception of philosophy (pp. 232-41). The first of these is a "legacy of suspicion," which essentially consists in a radicalizing of the critical spirit definitive of the Enlightenment. Here he emphasizes Hegel's rejection of immediacy in all of its possible manifestations. Following through on this rejection of immediacy and carrying it to its most radical conclusion brings us into the second central Hegelian legacy, "a legacy of mediation." The emphasis here is primarily on how Hegel's rejection of immediacy becomes reflexive in the sense of applying to the very notion of mediation itself. Dahlstrom presents this notoriously opaque, yet certainly fundamental, Hegelian notion by emphasizing Hegel's conception of both thought and reality as sharing a dynamic and holistic character which not only unifies, but at the same time preserves the diversity of its various moments and elements.

Dahlstrom goes on to discuss the other two Hegelian legacies, a "legacy of decentering finite subjectivity" and a "legacy of negation." The former focuses on the extent to which Hegel, despite the central role of the subject in his conception of the absolute, attempts to overcome any sort of subjectivism through the development of an infinite, absolute subject. The legacy of negation gives us a glimpse of Hegel's characteristic methodological insistence upon the positive results to be culled from any sense of negation, or rejection, of earlier moments in his assent to absolute science.

My concern here is not so much with the specifics of these elements -- I leave that to the reader. It is rather to suggest that Dahlstrom here neglects an extremely fundamental Hegelian legacy. Indeed, one could argue -- though I haven't the space to do so -- that this neglected legacy serves to provide a systematic unity to the four Dahlstrom elaborates. I will argue that quite central to Hegel's overall meta-philosophical thought is the recognition that any truly scientific manner of philosophizing must be capable of addressing the issue of the authority of our fundamental cognitive norms. As I will discuss below, there are moments in Dahlstrom's discussion of Hegel's attempt to deal with the problem of the objectivity of thought in his seventh essay when he does come very close to the idea I here have in mind. In particular, his emphasis on Hegel's concern with determining "rules of thinking," and his concordant rejection of "a conception of truth as a correspondence between forms of thought and some material allegedly given in a way ultimately beyond or inaccessible to the realm of thought," brings to the fore this crucial, normative, dimension in Hegel's thought (p. 106). Yet still, something is lacking in Dahlstrom's manner of dealing with this issue. As I will argue below, in Hegel's mind adequately addressing this normative issue requires moving beyond the overly theoretical perspective on the problem of the objectivity of thought characteristic of the Enlightenment in favor of a more pragmatic one. Grasping the true significance of this shift requires seeing how it emerged in the polemical assaults upon the critical philosophy by F. H. Jacobi and J. G. Hamann.

§3. Jacobi, Kant, and the Problem of the Objectivity of Thought

In the fourth essay of the collection, Dahlstrom turns to consider the polemical exchange between Kant and F. H. Jacobi. Of Dahlstrom's many important contributions throughout this collection, this piece (as well as the one following on the aesthetic holism of Hamann, Herder, and Schiller) may be the most impressive. Dahlstrom's treatment of Jacobi and Hamann presents their respective philosophies as not only influential for the subsequent post-Kantian idealists, but also as possessing a unique admirable, and quite sophisticated, philosophical complexity. Dahlstrom takes issue with the quite common superficial view of Jacobi as no more than an occasionally insightful polemicist whose own positive contributions amount to little more than an irrational fideism intended to extricate us from the nihilism resulting from taking the Enlightenment faith in reason to its logical, and inevitable, conclusions. Instead, he emphasizes the manner in which Jacobi attempted to develop his own alternative conception of rationality. As Dahlstrom presents it, this conception was based upon Jacobi's insistence that in place of the traditional Enlightenment conception of reason we must come to recognize an alternative conception that properly recognizes the true historical and practical character of rationality. These notions would come to have a significant positive influence upon the post-Kantian idealists and their contemporaries as they developed accounts of rationality with substantial historicist and practical components. Indeed, in Dahlstrom's fine portrait of Jacobi, we can begin to see more clearly why it is that Hegel himself spent so much effort and time in considering the thought of Jacobi in the very process of coming to formulate his own mature philosophical system.

Nonetheless, Dahlstrom neglects a crucial aspect of Jacobi's thought concerning the nature of reason, one which is equally responsible for his legacy in the eyes of the post-Kantian idealists. This is the fact that although beginning to lay the groundwork for a transition away from the Enlightenment conception of reason and cognition, he was ultimately unable to fully break away from its fundamental theoretical orientation. Although beginning to give voice to a distinctively practical conception of rationality, Jacobi was never able to fully divorce his views from those of his Enlightenment rivals to the same radical extent that would come to characterize post-Kantian German thought for the next century. His failure was due to his commitment to certain Enlightenment prejudices that he never did come to fully question. In fact, Hamann, rather than Jacobi, first securely laid the true foundation of the movement towards an alternative, more practically grounded philosophical orientation which would be extended and radicalized by Fichte and Hegel in their grand idealistic systems.

Jacobi's continued Enlightenment prejudice is most clearly seen in his adherence to a characteristically early modern conception of the problem of the objectivity of thought. For the early moderns, this problem of the objectivity of thought was an attempting to determine the extent to which the cognitive subject's internal, subjective, representations "mapped onto" some transcendent reality. Even for an idealist like Berkeley, avoiding subjectivism, and thus grounding the objectivity of cognition, required anchoring our subjective, cognitive sphere of representations to the transcendent realm of divine ideas. Jacobi, although highly critical of certain features of the Enlightenment's conception of reason, never turns a critical eye upon this preconception of what is required to objectively ground cognition. This is why his central polemic against Kant fixes its sights upon Kant's inability to consistently maintain the notion of the thing in itself. For, indeed, it is the thing in itself that serves as the transcendent ground of the contents of our cognitive representations in the Kantian system. Later, in Jacobi's charge of nihilism against Fichte, it is, once again, this Enlightenment presupposition that objectivity requires transcendence that does much of the heavy lifting.

But Kant is no mere Enlightenment thinker. Indeed, it is in Kant that an alternative, post-Enlightenment notion of the problem of objectivity of thought begins to surface. Granted Kant can be seen as using the thing in itself as the transcendent ground of the objectivity of the content of our cognitive representations, and, to that extent, his can be viewed as a fundamentally Enlightenment conception of the problem of objectivity. Yet this is not what constitutes the true essence of Kant's transcendental idealism, what truly contributes to his role as precursor to the post-Enlightenment thought of the German idealists. That essence, as Hegel clearly recognized, is most adequately expressed in his transcendental deduction of the categories. For it is in the transcendental deduction that Kant comes to provide his most explicit reformulation of the problem of objectivity, casting it in a radically different guise. The problem of objectivity here begins to take on two elements which represent a move beyond that of the Enlightenment. First, Kant came to see the problem of objectivity as fundamentally a normative problem. It was a problem concerning the authority of our cognitive norms or rules, which constitute our categorical cognitive schemes. Secondly, Kant came to recognize that the objective ground for such cognitive norms or categorical schemes mustn't rest in some realm transcending cognition itself, but rather must be in some manner or another within cognition. In other words, objectivity must be given an immanent grounding. In this sense, Kant attempts to demonstrate that the formal conditions of cognition have a normative objectivity deriving from the very nature of reason itself and thus not dependent on any transcendent ground whatsoever.

Now although Jacobi appears to have been blind to this insight in Kant's critical philosophy, J. G. Hamann was not. Dahlstrom's presentation of Hamann is truly commendable, and ought to be read by anyone wishing to understand not only this highly enigmatic figure, but also the post-Kantian idealists themselves. Nonetheless, he doesn't adequately bring this crucial insight and contribution of Hamann to light. Though, in all fairness to Dahlstrom, his concerns with Hamann are in a slightly different context since he is concerned primarily with Hamann's contribution to the legacy of aesthetic holism. Nonetheless, the sense in which Hamann's polemic against Kant represents a marked improvement over that of Jacobi's provides a crucial context for comprehending other topics that do fall under direct consideration in later essays of Dahlstrom's study so ought not to be neglected. In particular, fully understanding Hegel's skeptical concerns requires seeing how it is that Hegel was drawing upon Hamann's meta-critical attack upon Kant's attempt to establish the objectivity of our cognitive norms without appealing to any transcendent ground. As Hegel came to see it, "Hamann places himself in the middle of the problem of reason and presents its solution."[1] I now turn to a brief discussion of the sense in which Hamann accomplishes this in his polemic against Kant.

§4. Hamann's Meta-Critical Legacy

As Dahlstrom points out in his fifth essay, J. G. Hamann, along with J. G. Herder and Friedrich Schiller, stood at the head of the holistic legacy characteristic of one wing of the German "counter-Enlightenment" (p. 67). As he puts it, these three were "dedicated to the premise that the genuine meanings of things derive from their interactive functions in a dynamic, self-determining whole, albeit one that humans succeed in grasping merely in a fragmentary way" (p. 67). The import of this holistic conception ought to be evident to anyone with even a passing interest in the post-Kantian idealists, and Dahlstrom does a great job in drawing out the root of this conception in figures too often neglected in the Anglophone historical canon. Dahlstrom does a wonderful job demonstrating the positive influence Hamann had on the idealists and, as in his commendable presentation of Jacobi, presents Hamann as a positive philosopher of considerable depth in his own right.

Yet, it is here that Dahlstrom seems to miss the emergence of an element that is crucial to appreciating the core of the Hegelian legacy. This has to do with Hamann's "meta-critical" legacy, which ultimately served to present to Hegel the fundamental problem that his Phenomenology of Spirit was intended to address. Furthermore, it is also in this feature of Hamann's thought that Hegel was to see a key methodological tool which he would then put to considerable, positive philosophical use. Hence, Hegel's veneration of Hamann in the above quote as not only placing himself "in the middle of the problem of reason," but also, "presenting its solution."

The holistic character of Hamann's thought elucidated by Dahlstrom indeed does inform his critical stance in relation to Kant's first Critique in his polemical piece, Meta-Critique of the Critique of the Purism of Reason. For here, as Dahlstrom notes, Hamann rejects Kant's presupposed notion of a universal reason divorced from its concrete manifestation in cognitive agents within their given social and historical contexts. In essence, Hamann sees himself as playing Aristotle to Kant's Plato. Though what is most significant about Hamann's polemic can be located in two interrelated points of emphasis. Furthermore, it is in these two points that Hamann's polemic is decidedly more insightful than that of Jacobi. First, rather than focusing on the capacity of our first-order cognitive representations to be anchored to some transcendent source of objectivity, Hamann turns his critical gaze upon the second-order normative principles presupposed by, and taken as authoritative for, our first-order critical endeavors. In this sense, as Reinhold was to recognize, Hamann's meta-critical concern raised the very problem of the possibility of a science of knowledge, of epistemology itself. Hamann's meta-critical demand, albeit rather obliquely stated, was a call to determine the extent to which our second-order epistemological principles could themselves be rationally established.

The second crucial merit of Hamann's polemic is that he clearly saw that this second-order meta-critical issue was one concerning epistemic norms or rules. He recognized that Kant was attempting to deal with the issue of cognitive objectivity, at least in relation to the formal structure of cognition, by finding an immanent source of normative authority. It is here that Hamann goes after Kant, arguing that his attempt to find an objective source for these cognitive norms is ultimately rooted in an illegitimate 'purification' of reason. In keeping with his holism, Hamann rejects any such attempt to "purify," and thus, in essence, reify, reason by abstracting it from its embodiment in concrete cognitive agents. This also leads him to provide a negative answer to the above stated meta-critical demand. Hamann denies that a rational grounding for the objectivity of our epistemological principles can be found.

As I will point out below, it is this meta-critical problem that forms the fundamental concern of Hegel in the Phenomenology of Spirit, and which must be taken into account in attempting to make sense of his approach to the interrelated problems of skepticism and knowledge. Before moving to that, it is important to note again, that Hegel not only saw Hamann as providing the fundamental problem he was to address but also the most basic element of its very solution. For as Hegel saw it, Hamann's insistence upon viewing reason, or cognition, in its instantiation in concrete cognitive agents was to provide the very foundation of his attempt to determine an immanent source of objectivity for our cognitive norms.

§5. Hegel on Skepticism, the Problem of Objectivity: A Legacy of Normative Pragmatism

In this concluding section I will sketch some basic points that constitute a fundamental Hegelian legacy that I believe is lacking in Dahlstrom's analysis. Following in Hamann's footsteps, Hegel came to see the fundamental epistemological issue that must be addressed as a meta-critical one concerning the ability to justify our cognitive norms themselves. Here Hegel begins to move beyond the early modern conception of the problem of the objectivity of thought. For Hegel, the fundamental problem is not one of our ability to determine the extent to which our cognitive representations map onto some transcendent realm of truths. Instead the issue is the authority of our cognitive norms. Why am I as a cognitive agent bound to these laws of thought? What authority do they have, and what is its source? Hegel saw that this issue could not be grounded on some reference to a realm of transcendent facts or things-in-themselves, but rather was must be dealt with immanently by focusing on the relation between agents and the norms these agents come to manifest in their cognitive activities.[2] In attempting to address the problem of the objectivity of thought at this normative level, Hegel came to develop certain fundamentally pragmatic elements in his thought. I will attempt to get to the heart of this legacy by making three basic points concerning the project and methodology of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit.

1. Hegel's recognition of the meta-critical issue and its normative significance. The first crucial feature of what I am calling Hegel's legacy of normative pragmatics is his recognition of the essential normative import of Hamann's meta-critical challenge. Hegel clearly saw that the fundamental issue that must be dealt with prior to engaging in the sort of critical endeavors aspired to by Kant was that of the authority of our second-order epistemic norms. Kant himself was well aware of this. But if indeed Hamann was correct, Kant failed to appreciate the depth of the problem, the true essence of which brings to the fore the very question of the possibility of epistemology itself. It is at this level that we encounter Hegel's fundamental confrontation with skepticism.

The skeptical challenge that is of fundamental concern for Hegel in the Phenomenology is a second-order meta-critical skepticism that arises out of a clear understanding of the true import of Sextus Empiricus' problem of the criterion. This second-order skepticism fixates its skeptical tropes upon the very possibility of justifying our second-order critical principles, or cognitive norms, themselves.[3] While Dahlstrom at times seems to recognize the second-order nature of this skepticism, there are points where he seems to fail to grasp its import and ends up blurring the distinction between this meta-critical skepticism and the sort of first-order veil of perception skepticism that Hegel sees his approach to the problem of knowledge as rendering wholly inconsequential. This is a crucial distinction that must be clearly grasped in order to understand the sense in which Hegel is, in fact, attempting to provide an epistemology in the Phenomenology of Spirit. It is Hegel's engagement with skepticism at the second-order level, rather than at the first-order level, that paves the way for his radical revision to the very nature of epistemology itself.

2. Hegel's practical shift: from theory of knowledge to the critique of cognitive practices. Hegel also seems to have picked up from Hamann the notion that any success in meeting the meta-critical challenge hinges on an ability to move beyond a view of epistemology as a theoretical inquiry into the 'truth' of cognition. Seeing epistemology as an attempt to discover the 'true' nature of cognition itself, or some inquiry into the essential nature of 'pure reason', simply thrusts us headlong into the problem of the criterion, for it presupposes the very sorts of critical principles that we are hereby calling into question.

Hegel thus argues that any possibility of overcoming the sort of meta-critical skeptical concerns that a radical commitment to the very ideals of the critical philosophy entails recognizes that epistemology itself must proceed as a practical inquiry that attempts to evaluate not some thing (or some reified cognitive entity) but rather the practices of cognitive agents embedded within the world. The essential meta-critical question is thus one concerning the rules by which these practices are carried out. Why ought a cognitive agent come to adopt some such set of normative commitments over any other? From where do these cognitive norms derive their authority to govern the practices of a cognitive agent?[4] Hegel thus moves epistemology closer to contemporary practical normative theory than to standard contemporary epistemological debates, for Hegel's primary concern is that of the source of normativity itself in relation to distinctively practical endeavors of agents. The key question that then arises for Hegel is how to conduct any such practical evaluation of our rules of cognitive practice in a manner that both allows for some such set of norms to be objectively validated, yet does so without making an illegitimate appeal to some transcendent ground of that validity. This, in a nutshell, is Hegel's construal of the problem of the objectivity of thought.

3. Hegel's meta-epistemological methodology and normative pragmatism. In discussing the meta-epistemological methodology Hegel devises to deal with the normative, practical construal of the problem of the objectivity of thought, I will be exceedingly brief, hoping to simply sketch the fundamental pragmatic element within that methodology. Hegel argues that in order to evaluate a set of cognitive norms we must attempt to know the world according to those norms. The adequacy of these attempts to know are grounded in their capacity for allowing the cognitive agent to successfully accomplish the very cognitive projects that agent takes as constitutive of his first-order epistemic endeavors. Such projects, together with the norms manifested by the agent possessing them, are constitutive of a form of consciousness. For Hegel, the adequacy of our cognitive norms to 'get their work done' stands as the criterion by which these norms are to be evaluated. In essence, this moves Hegel's epistemology away from what could be termed a cognitive model of epistemology towards an alternative model that takes certain conative features of the cognitive agent to possess a certain fundamental primacy in the process of determining the objective validity of epistemic norms. What counts as knowing for Hegel depends upon the conative drives of the cognitive agent -- viz., the projects and tasks that the cognitive agents takes as its nature to accomplish. The issue of the objectivity of our cognitive norms then comes down to an attempt to establish an objectively valid conatus of consciousness. Indeed, it is this project that is central in the Phenomenology's attempt to deal with the problem of the objectivity of thought and which, for Hegel, ultimately gets solved through his interpretation of the early romantic notion of Bildung as the summum bonum of an individual agent.

The key point for now though is to recognize that, for Hegel, this notion of dealing with the problem of the objectivity of thought contains the fundamentally pragmatic move of evaluating normative structures in terms of their appropriateness for certain tasks or projects and thus placing a primary emphasis on certain conative elements in his epistemology. It is this pragmatic legacy which seems lacking in Dahlstrom's otherwise stellar construal of the Hegelian legacy. Again, in his seventh essay, Dahlstrom brings us to the very brink of this issue in his discussion of Hegel's concern with the problem of the objectivity of thought. He sees that Hegel was moving beyond a distinctively early modern conception of the problem in his rejection of any analysis that sees the objectivity of our thoughts as resting upon their correspondence with some realm of facts beyond consciousness. Furthermore, he also sees Hegel's alternative construal of this problem as involving a determination of the proper 'rules of thought,' or the proper interrelations and principles constitutive of the cognitive agent's complex normative schema. Nonetheless, Dahlstrom appears to miss how this ultimately drives Hegel towards a distinctively pragmatic conception of the objective validity of these normative structures.

In closing, I would simply like to reinforce that the collection of essays Dahlstrom gives us is top rate. It not only advances historical scholarship on Kant, Hegel, and the other figures discussed -- primarily, Jacobi, Hamann, Herder, and Schiller -- but it does so in a way that forces the reader to engage in philosophical dialogue with these figures. It is in this spirit that I have tried to engage with this fine collection.

[1] Hegel, The Writings of Hamann, p. 36 (translated by Lisa Marie Anderson in Hegel on Hamann (Northwestern University Press. Evanston, 2008)).

[2] Among recent Hegel commentators Terry Pinkard seems to most clearly discern this element in Hegel. Robert Pippin also does a very nice job of drawing out these sorts of normative concerns in Hegel.

[3] On the problem of the criterion in Hegel see the various works by Kenneth Westphal. Westphal clearly sees the role that the problem of the criterion plays in motivating Hegel, but fails to appreciate where this drives him -- namely, away from the early modern conception of the very nature of the problem of knowledge, or the problem of the objectivity of thought.

[4] Terry Pinkard does an excellent job of drawing out Hegel's concern with these normative issues.