Philosophical Logic

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John P. Burgess, Philosophical Logic, Princeton UP, 2009, 153pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691137896.

Reviewed by Alasdair Urquhart, University of Toronto



Burgess’s concise introduction to philosophical logic appears in the series Princeton Foundations of Contemporary Philosophy. In the preface, the author explains that he has aimed at providing a foundation for philosophical logic “sufficient to equip the reader to follow basic applications in analytic philosophy, and to tackle if desired more advanced works,” the background assumed being only that supplied by “any good introductory textbook” (p. vii). In spite of this, Burgess manages to include in his little monograph a surprisingly large quantity of technical material, even though much of it is only sketched.

The book is partly based on materials presented in the author’s seminar “Heresies in Logic”; it is primarily aimed at analytic philosophers who need some technical background in the parts of logic most heavily used in philosophical discussions. Although the first chapter offers a quick sketch of classical logic, the remaining chapters discuss nonclassical logics, namely, temporal logic, modal logic, conditional logic, relevantistic logic and intuitionistic logic. Although applications to artificial intelligence and computer science are mentioned, they are subordinated to philosophical motivations.

Chapter 1 gives a very brief review of the syntax and semantics of classical sentential and predicate logic. The basic results on completeness and decidability are mentioned, but not proved.

Chapter 2, the first really substantial chapter, is devoted to temporal logic in the style of Arthur Prior, where a future tense operator Fq and past tense operator Pq are added to classical sentential logic. After defining models for this language, Burgess introduces the minimal temporal logic L0 (Prior’s name for this logic was Kt, by analogy with the well known minimal modal logic K); the rules and axioms of the minimal logic L0 are developed briefly. The minimal temporal logic results when we place no conditions on the structure of time. The succeeding sections discuss the logics of time resulting when conditions are imposed that are assumed in classical and relativistic physics; for example, the conditions of transitivity and density validate certain formulas of temporal logic. Next is a brief discussion of Hamblin’s theorem that there are only fourteen “tenses” or temporal modalities if time is assumed to have the structure of the classical real line. The last section of this chapter discusses quantified temporal logic, and introduces the concept of rigid designator in the context of the logic of identity.

The third chapter is on the topic of modal logic. Although modal logic is probably of more interest to philosophers than temporal logic, Burgess chooses to discuss it later because of the greater intuitive clarity of the temporal modalities. He begins with semantical analysis based on Kripke models; he prefers the neutral terminology of “states” to the metaphysically loaded “possible worlds”. He follows this with a motivational discussion of different kinds of modality, such as dynamic, epistemic and deontic; logical and metaphysical necessity are distinguished, in the style of Kripke’s Naming and Necessity. A technical section follows, introducing the logics K, S4, S4.2, S4.3 and S5, both from the semantic and syntactic point of view. A remarkable feature of this chapter is that it includes both completeness and decidability proofs. Completeness is proved using the standard canonical model method, while a proof of the finite model property for K is sketched. On the question of the correct modal logic for representing logical necessity, Burgess argues that S5 fits the bill. The chapter closes with a very brief discussion of quantified modal logic, as well as Quine’s critique.

There follows a chapter on the logic of indicative and counterfactual conditionals. After a short section on Gricean conversational implicature, Burgess discusses the probabilistic theory of indicative conditionals, including the Adams probabilistic criterion for asserting them. The main result here is David Lewis’s trivialization theorem, according to which there is no conditional connective for which a conditional probability can be identified with the probability of a conditional (given certain plausible assumptions). The succeeding section discusses what Burgess calls the “remoteness theory of indicative conditionals”, better known as the “Lewis-Stalnaker theory of conditionals”. Next comes a completeness proof for inferences from conditionals to conditionals (no embedded conditionals allowed); the validity notion is based on the Adams criterion. The remainder of the chapter is given over to mostly philosophical discussion about conventional implicature, and the difficulties involved in interpreting the relation of “remoteness from reality” used in the semantics of conditionals in terms of similarity in relevant respects.

The fifth chapter is on the topic of “relevantistic logic”, a terminology peculiar to this monograph. Burgess uses this idiosyncratic phrase because he wishes to include here not only relevance logics in the style of Anderson and Belnap, but also systems such as Parry’s analytic implication. Also included here is dialethism, the view that there are true contradictory statements — the commonly used term “dialetheism” is subjected to scathing criticism on philological grounds. This chapter stands out from the others by its polemical tone. In the other chapters, Burgess is generally content to enumerate the various systems, justifying the existence of alternative systems of modal logic (for example) by allowing that there can be alternative senses of necessity and possibility. Here, though, he mounts a direct attack on the motivation given to justify these systems of alternative logic. He argues that three basic principles (disjunction introduction, transitivity of entailment and disjunctive syllogism) are all indispensable in mathematical practice, and so the “relevantistic logicians” fail in their goal of giving a descriptive criticism of orthodox mathematical practice (p. 110). He does allow, though, that such logics can be of interest in practical applications; for example, Belnap’s suggested use of the four-valued logic underlying first-degree entailment in databases. On the purely technical side, the chapter includes a short development of the pure implicational part of the relevance logic R (Church’s weak theory of implication), and brief mention of other technical results in the area.

The sixth and final chapter is on intuitionistic logic. Dummett, rather than Brouwer, is the main focus here — probably a wise choice, since contemporary analytic philosophers are more apt to find Dummett’s neo-Wittgensteinian motivation to their liking than Brouwer’s idealistic philosophy. After a short discussion on the notion of constructive proof, Burgess expounds the meaning of the logical operations in terms of their inferential role. A section on an axiomatic formulation of intuitionistic sentential logic follows, and then a description of the double-negation interpretation of classical theorems. Next is the Gödel interpretation of intuitionistic sentential logic in the modal system S4, and the closely related topic of Kripke’s semantics for intuitionism. A completeness proof for the sentential part of intuitionism using the canonical model is sketched, followed by a discussion of intermediate logics and intuitionistic predicate logic. Kripke models are of course classical in nature; Burgess gives a short but sensitive discussion of the question of whether an intuitionistically acceptable completeness proof can be given — infinitely proceeding sequences in the Brouwerian sense are briefly introduced in this connection.

Burgess has managed to pack an amazing amount of good material into this short monograph, and it can be confidently recommended to any philosopher who wishes to go beyond an introductory logic course and venture into the wilds of philosophical logic. The technical details are of necessity sketchy, but the author provides the reader with helpful lists for further reading at the end of each chapter, as well as a good bibliography. This is an excellent little book, and deserves wide success.