Philosophical Myths of the Fall

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Stephen Mulhall, Philosophical Myths of the Fall, Princeton University Press, 2005, 160pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691122202.

Reviewed by Elizabeth S. Goodstein, Emory University


In Philosophical Myths of the Fall, Stephen Mulhall puts forward a challenging, indeed, a provocative thesis:

that we might think of [Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein] … as wanting to preserve a recognizable descendent of the Christian conception of human nature as always already averting us from the relation to truth, comprehension, and clarity that is nevertheless our birthright -- hence, as structurally perverse or errant and yet redeemable from that fallen state -- but as refusing to accept that such redemption is attainable only from a transcendent or divine source (11).

In so doing, he presents himself as setting a course between "the religious reader," which for him means one who adheres to Christian doctrine, and "the secular reader," who regards the very notion of original sin as "a morally and rationally incomprehensible conception of the human condition" (11-12). Mulhall's overriding objective is to demonstrate not only that this doctrine is comprehensible but indeed that the idea of human "fallenness" provides a compelling framework for understanding the philosophical agendas of the thinkers he examines. Thus it is the objection he imputes to "the religious reader" that will structure his reflections: that since "to dispense with such a relation to divinity threatens to deprive the interpretive schema -- call it the myth -- of redemption of its very intelligibility," such philosophers will succumb to the hubris of placing themselves or their theories in the role of God (11). The "basic question" the book addresses is, as Mulhall puts it: "can one say what the Christian has to say about the human condition as fallen, and yet mean it otherwise?" (13). An intriguing question, and one that, as we shall see, applies even more emphatically to Mulhall himself than to his subjects.

Philosophical Myths of the Fall, which has its origins in a series of lectures Mulhall gave at the Catholic University of Leuven in 2003, consists of three essay-like chapters on Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein framed by a brief introduction and conclusion. On Mulhall's reading, all three philosophers regard human beings as "structurally perverse," call for us to "learn to live with a conception of ourselves as essentially enigmatic to ourselves," and put forward "a certain kind of intellectual practice that is also a spiritual practice" through which a non-religious mode of redemption becomes possible precisely in and through the acceptance of "the human being's constitutive resistance to its own grasp" (12). Moving fluidly from Cavell to Augustine, Kierkegaard to Shakespeare, Mulhall weaves together an enticing reading.

According to Mulhall, Nietzsche fails to distance himself sufficiently from the structures of the Christian thought he would condemn. "Nietzsche's apparently heterodox project" repeatedly "turns out to reproduce rather than transcend a paradoxical structure of Christian thought" (44). As "essentially a further step in the unfolding of the perverse form of the will to power that is Christian asceticism," his conception of life can only find "perverse, self-subverting forms of expression" (40). Just as the parable of the death of God draws upon and reinscribes the symbolics of death and resurrection, Nietzsche's critiques of morality and asceticism depend upon the understanding of human existence he condemns. Mulhall argues not simply that (inverting Cavell's suggestion about Nietzsche's relation to Christianity) Christianity confronts in Nietzsche's thought "the truth in foul disguise." The chapter's concluding passage ventures a much stronger assertion: if "his genealogy of morality constitute[s] a recounting of our fallenness and our redemption, which works essentially by transposing Nietzsche himself" into the position of Christ, then his critique of "Christianity's so-called libel against ordinary, embodied, historical human existence is in fact a further expression of that libel" (44-45).

Mulhall's position, reiterated in the subsequent readings, is that since efforts to free thinking about human being from the notion of fallenness amount to calls for redemption, they end by reinscribing the very doctrines they would criticize. However, the claim that "Nietzsche's genealogy of Christianity embodies its own myth of the Fall" (38) turns on a reading of The Genealogy of Morals that assimilates the world of the "blond beasts" to humanity's "prelapsarian state" (42) and has him "imput[ing] fallenness to some of those who dwell in paradise [viz., the 'priests']" (43). In other words, the notion that Nietzsche's play with myth in his (sometimes, but by no means exclusively, mimetic) critique of Christianity is saying "what the Christian has to say about the human condition as fallen" depends on a horizon of interpretation that is itself emphatically Christian. I shall return to this point.

In his discussion of Heidegger, Mulhall makes even more innovative use of a commonplace that might be viewed as the secular (in)version of the concept of heresy: the notion that the echoes of past forms of thought and in particular the presence of metaphors or other figures of theological origin undermine or subvert the perspective of thinkers who are attempting to use inherited language to forge new forms of thought and understanding. As he notes in the opening sentence of the chapter, "it is no secret that the concepts and values of Christianity constitute a fundamental reference point" (46) for the early Heidegger; the issue is whether his rethinking of "the theological roots of the traditional conception of human being" (47) is radical enough to found something truly new, whether he can successfully "use the words of Christianity … whilst meaning them otherwise" (49).

In an argument that turns on Heidegger's inability to establish a stable distinction between the realms of the ontic and the ontological with respect to everydayness, Mulhall assimilates the existential analysis of Dasein, as well, to the myth of original sin, arguing that for Heidegger, "in effect, our fallennness is internal to our Being" (52). Even on the most charitable possible reading of the ambiguities in Heidegger's text, he contends, the philosopher is pointing to entanglement in the inauthentic as a constitutive dilemma of human existence. But if Heidegger shows not only that "Dasein's nature is such that it bars its own way to what belongs most properly to that nature," but also that Dasein has a "self-inflicted blindness to its defining capacity to own its own life," then, Mulhall thinks, "he is reiterating with remarkable faithfulness the Christian perception of human beings as at once irremediably lost and open to redemption" (56).

At this point, Mulhall's argument takes a distinctive turn, moving well beyond claiming that Heidegger's analyses reinscribe theological figures of thought. Like Kierkegaard, according to Mulhall, Heidegger regards human existence as fundamentally enigmatic; indeed, for both, "it is a mark of the accuracy of any account of human nature that it find itself confronting and acknowledging a constitutive resistance to its desire for a complete and total account of its object" (66). By these same standards, he writes, "the myth of the Fall --" with its emphasis on "the origin of human existence as essentially enigmatic and perverse, and the essential aspects of human nature … as beyond coherent representation -- bears the distinguishing marks of truth" (66). Mulhall appears to be suggesting that the philosophers' failure to transcend the Christian theological paradigm constitutes a proof of its truth.

In the final section of the chapter, "Humanity as Animality," Mulhall defends Heidegger against critics who aver that the body is absent from Being and Time. Embodiment is, on the contrary, omnipresent: "in a sense, every sentence devoted to Dasein is devoted to it" (69). As the section title underlines, his defense takes place on very Christian territory: "the truth of the matter, as Heidegger sees it, is that there is neither a simple discontinuity nor a simple continuity between humanity and animality; there is, rather, an essentially enigmatic, uncannily intimate distance between the two -- of a kind that is (I suggest) more satisfactorily encapsulated in the Christian myth of the Fall than in its secular alternatives" (68). The terms of the discussion have been transformed. It is no longer a matter of investigating Heidegger's thinking for theological residues but of testing his work against the standard of truth set by the Christian myth.

Via a reading of his 1929-30 lectures on "The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude," Mulhall assimilates Heidegger's account of animality to the Christian narrative. Like Heidegger, he abstracts the text's interpretation of boredom as the fundamental mood of modernity from its historical context. But while Heidegger emphasizes the links between boredom and Dasein's relation to death and finitude as such, Mulhall draws boredom into relation to animality. He argues that for Heidegger "human beings fulfill their nature as a species by suffering a radical reorientation of their creatureliness from within" (83) and concludes that Heidegger's "conception of the enigmatically perverse animality of the human is plainly a concise recounting of the Christian myth of the Fall" (84)! Leaving aside the question of whether such a thing is really so plain -- I refrain from delving any deeper since I have discussed Heidegger's interpretation of boredom at length elsewhere (Experience without Qualities: Boredom and Modernity, Stanford UP, 2005) -- this is a somewhat astonishing claim. As in the reading of Nietzsche, a philosophical effort to reflect upon and reconfigure the horizon of traditional thought is reduced to the theological tropes with which it resonates and then accused of failing to be "essentially different" (84) from the original. While such arguments are usually advanced in order to dismiss philosophers as metaphysicians, here the Christian narrative holds all the trumps.

Mulhall seems most sympathetic to Wittgenstein, whom he conceives of as attempting to foster "a kind of conversion" (89, 113). On his reading, Wittgenstein's approach to philosophizing is not so much attempting unsuccessfully to escape its theological models as rewriting those models for a skeptical age. His conception of knowledge as "necessarily conditioned" is a response to the very human "desire to deny the human, to interpret limits as limitations," and thereby repudiate finitude. From this perspective, "the human desire to speak outside language games is an inflection of the prideful human craving to be God, and Wittgenstein's philosophical practice aims not so much to eradicate this apparently ineradicable hubris but instead to diagnose it" and examine its "endlessly renewed realization in particular cases" wherever and however it may appear (94). Nonetheless, when the "therapeutic philosopher" whose words disclose "and make us ashamed of our present confused and disoriented state" steps into the position of savior (95), it perhaps "amount[s] to a further expression of the very hubris that it aims to combat" (96).

In an intriguing reading of the first sections of the Philosophical Investigations as a nuanced response to Augustine's Confessions, Mulhall elaborates an interpretation of Wittgenstein as "contesting a Nietzschean strand of Augustine's tale," to wit, that people are "driven and mastered by the need to submit the world to their will" (106). At stake is a "recovery of the ordinary" (107) that also recognizes the "poverty" of cultural "practices and conceptions" that "stultif[y] the human imagination" (111) so that people fail to live their authentic lives -- an "enigmatic perversity" that Augustine viewed "as an aspect of our fallen condition" (112). While Wittgenstein may seem to reject such a "depiction of the human condition as originally sinful" (113), Mulhall argues that his account of speech and desire is a "virtual transcription" (113) of RenĊ½ Girard's famous rereading of that very doctrine. Thus, since Wittgenstein's "philosophical practice appears importantly, internally, mimetic of certain related aspects of the Christian understanding of the world," the question becomes how to interpret the philosopher's "implicit presentation" of that practice "as a species of radical cultural and spiritual critique": is it "to be read from a theological point of view as hubris or as acknowledgment?" (116). While Mulhall leaves this open, he concludes that "Christianity is in possession of at least some of the right words for what Wittgenstein has it at heart to say" (117).

Returning in the conclusion to his thesis that all three thinkers see "human beings as standing in need of redemption"(118), Mulhall elaborates on the Christian perspective he has developed throughout the book. Beings in need of redemption are not simply imperfect, he writes, but "wretched" -- or rather, perverse, "turned against ourselves by virtue of what makes us human" (118) and, as a consequence, "enigmatic or mysterious" to ourselves (119). While all three thinkers have different ways of articulating these perspectives, they "converge upon a conception of humans as inherently subject to a perverse and enigmatic desire either for or to be God" (120). Thus in all three, the "structural perversity of desire uncannily reproduces the key articulations of the very Christian conception of fallen humanity from which we are supposedly to be redeemed" (120). Mulhall wants to draw not only the relatively uncontroversial conclusion that it will remain difficult to construct a "conception of the human condition that genuinely transcends the Christian theological horizon within which Western culture has developed" (120-121) -- at least, one might add, for philosophers working in the western tradition. He goes on to suggest that the recurrence of the "general notion of redemption" linked to "an enigmatic perversity of desire" he has discovered in all three thinkers "might also give us reason to take seriously the possibility that any sufficiently rigorous attempt to give an account of the human mode of being will find itself recurring to (even reiterating) the core tenets of Christianity precisely because those tenets are genuinely responsive to something deep and determining in human nature" (120-121).

This is a truly astonishing claim for a theological doctrine that has been imposed in unsavory and often violent ways upon so many nations whose vision of human nature did not include the intuition of an original sinfulness! Mulhall's contention that the thinkers he examines "wish to retain or reconstruct an originally Christian conception of ourselves as in need of redemption from ourselves" does appear to turn on a weaker claim for the disclosive power of the myth of the fall, and his readings tend to move by suggestions, allusions, and metaphoric extensions and inversions and to end in rhetorically open questions rather than absolute claims. However, in the end, Mulhall's argument is not simply that such philosophies, by "tak[ing] their readers to the limits of a wholly secular, Enlightened conception of the human creature and its place in the universe" (123), "hold open the possibility of taking religious points of view seriously" (124) or allow Christianity to appear "as a viable, humanly inhabitable, intellectual and moral stance" in the modern world (124). His conviction that the tenets of Christianity reveal the truth about human beings authorizes the argumentative strategy I have traced, in which he repeatedly discovers structural evidence of philosophers "recurring to (even reiterating) the core tenets of Christianity" at the heart of their attempts to formulate worldly visions of redemption. While there is much of interest in Mulhall's readings, his attempt to thereby resurrect the explanatory power of the notion of original sin as the foundation of a "structural perversity of human desire" is highly problematic. Those of us who are mindful of the transgressions committed against humanity in the name of the doctrines he regards as "genuinely responsive to something deep and determining in human nature" must take his arguments with more than a grain of salt.